Language and Being: Heidegger's Linguistics

Placeholder book cover

Duane Williams, Language and Being: Heidegger's Linguistics, Bloomsbury, 2017, 218pp., $114.00, ISBN 9781472573155.

Reviewed by William McNeill, DePaul University


This book provides a useful exploration of Heidegger's understanding of language in relation to his thinking of Being, arguing that these two, language and Being, are inextricably intertwined. Although Being is not reducible to language, the disclosure of something as being (and thus standing in Being) occurs only by way of language. Language is thus, in Heidegger's famous phrase from his "Letter on 'Humanism'" that serves as the foundation of this present study, "the house of Being," creating a dwelling site or abode in which humans and all things can be. Heidegger's reflections on language are not only notoriously difficult and complicated, but also appear "scattered in an assortment of essays," as the author puts it, and the stated purpose of this book is thus not so much to systematize those reflections, but "to gather and elucidate them." (11)

In this, the book succeeds quite well, offering a helpful overview of the many different aspects and stages of development of Heidegger's thinking on language. Williams sets out from the problem of the "forgetting of Being" and the concomitant "homelessness" of modern human beings who, particularly in the era of subjectivity, regard language as a mere instrument or tool, or as a means of expression for inner thoughts. He proceeds to examine Heidegger's interpretation of the Presocratic, Heraclitean logos, his later thinking of the ontological difference and the event (Ereignis) of Being as the event of language, and the poetic essence of language. The study concludes with an affirmation of Heidegger's argument that the alleged "destitution" and homelessness of modern human beings is in no small part due to our ill-conceived relation to language. The human being, on Heidegger's account, is fundamentally not the Subject that has language at his or her disposal; rather, language, in its showing, brings beings to light in the first instance, including those beings called "humans." It is not humans as Subjects who speak, nor are humans the masters of language, rather language itself speaks and humans become such only in response to language.

One of the virtues of this study is its direct and accessible style. It takes careful account throughout of the possible objections to Heidegger's views on language, and especially the common accusation that Heidegger is some kind of language mystic or charlatan, uttering supposed profundities in "Heideggerese" that are fundamentally vacuous or can never be verified, issuing in little more than tautologies in the end. Indeed, what could be more tautological than the book's concluding pronouncement: "Being is."? One of the most valuable and original aspects of the book, however, is that rather than dismissing or criticizing the later Heidegger's tautological thinking, Williams brings it into dialogue with non-Western thought, including Advaita Vedanta, Buddhism, and the Tao Te Ching. Heidegger's "Dialogue on Language" with the Japanese thinker Tezuka also plays a prominent role throughout the book. Williams does not deny that Heidegger "has affinities with certain apophatic mystics" and with negative theology, but he inflects these affinities positively to emphasize that in order to understand Heidegger's language, one must participate in the "way to language" and the experience of language from out of which Heidegger himself speaks. He points out that "despite sounding at times like an apophatic mystic, Heidegger does not make of Being something transcendent," but instead emphasizes "the concretely immanent presence of Being in all beings." (34) Being is never an object for Heidegger, no more than language itself. As the author rightly insists, "Heidegger's approach to language is to not think or speak about language, but to think or speak from out of language's reality with the intention that in this way we are led to its reality." And this is what is indicated by Heidegger's stated goal: "to bring language as language to language." (7-8) Unless we are prepared to follow and to partake in Heidegger's way to language, his language will indeed seem like empty mysticism.

Of course, the book's subtitle Heidegger's Linguistics will immediately strike any seasoned reader of Heidegger as indicative of an unfortunate misunderstanding of what Heidegger's reflections on language are all about. If by "linguistics" we mean the scientific study of language, then that is certainly not Heidegger's project. Indeed, the Introduction acknowledges this straightaway, noting that Heidegger instead "challenges established approaches in linguistics," and adding that "it might be more accurate to refer apophatically to 'Heideggerian unlinguistics'." (1) Yet why, then, continue to use the misleading term "linguistics" to describe Heidegger's reflections on language at all? The book seems somewhat ambivalent on this question, and I suspect that this ambivalence has its roots in a failure to distinguish between the early and the later Heidegger specifically with regard to their respective stance concerning the status of science. The author notes that, in the early work Being and Time (1927), "Heidegger argues that the science of language, namely linguistics, still views discourse as assertion. He adds: 'If, however, we take this phenomenon in principle to have the fundamental primordiality and scope of an existential, the necessity arises of re-establishing the linguistics on an ontologically more primordial foundation'." (65) Being and Time is as yet in search of that ontologically more primordial foundation, "asking preliminary questions about the being [sic] of language," as Williams puts it. It makes sense in terms of the project of Being and Time, where phenomenological ontology is conceived as the "science of the Being of beings," that Heidegger would at that point understand his "fundamental ontology" as pursuing the foundation upon which regional sciences, such as linguistics, could first be scientifically grounded. Just a few pages later, however, the book ascribes this task to the Heidegger of some 17 years later, who interprets the logos of Heraclitus as the saying that is the gathering of the One and the All, of Being. Williams comments here:

"the One, the All and Being", says Heidegger, "hold sway in the logos, which likewise holds sway in their very essence." It would seem, then, and this will be crucial in enabling Heidegger to establish linguistics on an ontologically more primordial foundation, that the One, the All and Being are only perceivable through the logos. (69)

Yet establishing linguistics on an ontologically more primordial foundation is not at all part of Heidegger's agenda in 1944, when the Heraclitus lecture was given. Not only is the later Heidegger of this period not doing ontology, but he is not at all seeking to ground the sciences through a scientific phenomenology of Being. For the very project of science has in the meantime undergone an intense critique, one that also implicates Heidegger's own early, scientific aspirations.

This indeed is indicative of one of the more frustrating shortcomings of this book, namely, the tendency, present throughout, to leap from one text of Heidegger's to another with minimal, or often no, signaling of the transitions, so that the reader is often left adrift, wondering which text we are dealing with now (and from which period). Frequent consultation of the endnotes is thus advised. Despite the fact that he is clearly aware that Heidegger's thought is continually developing and changing, the author seems to minimize the shifts in perspective that this entails. He tends to write as though Heidegger's many texts form a homogenous corpus from which a largely consistent or systematic view of language could be discerned. And the same holds with regard to Heidegger's thinking of Being, and especially of the ontological difference. When the book concludes with the words "And what is? Being is.", it remains rather unclear why this would not be a forgetting of the ontological difference, that is, of the difference between Being and beings that Heidegger had earlier insisted upon. Certainly, the early Heidegger could not have said such a thing. More confusing still is the claim that "To ask what is 'Is' is to ask after the Beingness of Being" (19); and that it is "this Beingness of Being that Heidegger seeks." (33) Confusing, because Heidegger used the term "beingness" (Seiendheit) to refer to the metaphysical understanding of Being as the ground of beings, precisely the understanding that his own thinking sought to overcome in distinguishing beingness from Being itself (or Being as Being). In Heidegger's terms, to ask what the "is" means, to ask concerning the meaning of Being, is precisely not to ask concerning beingness.

One gets the sense that this is very much a kind of work in progress, a work in which the author himself is struggling to understand what Heidegger is saying regarding Being and language, and that we readers are invited to join in that struggle. For the most part, the reader will be appreciative of the open and accessible style in which the struggle is articulated. Occasionally, the author goes astray on particular points, such as in a discussion of the Lichtung, or "clearing" of Being, when he claims that "The words lichtung [sic] and lichten are derived from licht, meaning 'light'," and that "Heidegger's reference to light is influenced here by Plato's analogy of the cave" (92). In support, he cites a lengthy passage from Heidegger's essay "The End of Philosophy and the Task of Thinking" that includes the statement "The adjective licht is the same word as 'light'." Yet, as the German for "light," leicht, here indicates, "light" in this statement means light in the sense of buoyant, having little weight, not light in the sense of the light that shines and illuminates; and to "lighten" in Heidegger's sense means to make light in the sense of to make "free and open." Indeed, the author conveniently omits from this lengthy passage a sentence that shows that Heidegger is claiming precisely the opposite of what Williams claims, namely, that the licht from which Lichtung derives is not related to shining or illumination. In the omitted sentence, Heidegger explicitly states: "What is light in the sense of being free and open has nothing in common with the adjective 'light' which means 'bright', neither linguistically nor materially." While Heidegger indeed goes on to show the possible relation between the two senses of "light," namely, that light in the sense of illumination presupposes the opening of the clearing (and Williams also acknowledges this sense of the opening), he is at pains to keep these two senses of light distinct from one another.

In general, this book does a better job articulating Heidegger's reflections on language than on Being. Aside from the aforementioned concerns regarding "beingness" and the ontological difference, other articulations of Being would seem to call for greater attentiveness and care in their formulation. When the author writes, for example, that language as poiesis is a "bringing forth beings from out of Being" (90), it begins to sound as though Being is some kind of transcendent source or origin, already "there" -- and this is a sense one gets especially from many of the formulations in the later parts of the book. Would it not be more appropriate to say that language brings forth beings into Being, thus bringing forth or accomplishing Being itself? Similarly, when the author embraces Heidegger's Heraclitean logos as the gathering of Being as the One and the All, one would expect at least the question of how and why this does not reinscribe the classical structure of ontotheology that Heidegger supposedly seeks to overcome. There are other minor concerns too: German nouns are capitalized half the time, but only half the time, leading to glaring inconsistencies (such as the failure to capitalize Lichtung in the passage cited above), and German words are frequently misspelt (the most egregious offender is Gerhorsha, [67 line 5] instead of Gehorsam, an infelicity that will make any German ear cringe). The word Being too is capitalized inconsistently, so that the reader sometimes gets a bit lost; and das Seiende is sometimes rendered as the plural "beings," sometimes as "being," which risks conflation with (uncapitalized) Being, or Sein.

Despite these shortcomings and concerns, this book offers a helpful interpretation of the relation of language and Being in Heidegger's thought, and can be recommended as providing a courageous effort to grapple with an immensely difficult topic.