Language, Madness, and Desire: On Literature

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Michel Foucault, Language, Madness, and Desire: On Literature, Philippe Artièries, Jean-François Bert, Mathieu Potte-Bonneville, and Judith Revel (eds.), Robert Bononno (tr.), University of Minnesota Press, 2015, 158pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780816693238.

Reviewed by Mark Olssen, University of Surrey


This book, originally published in French as La grande étrangère: À propos de littérature in 2013, comprising Michel Foucault's comments on literature, constitutes a welcome if late addition to the Foucault archive of accessible books. It offers Foucault's views on literature in different contexts and formats over the period 1960-1971. It is based upon typed transcripts of oral presentations Foucault gave in radio broadcasts and lectures. The editors have rendered these presentations as literal as possible, correcting errors and punctuation to improve readability, but being careful to comply with Foucault's original intentions. The book also includes a valuable assemblage of notes and biographic information about the editors. The first section, Language and Madness, comprises two radio broadcasts presented by Foucault in 1963. The second section offers a lecture, 'Literature and Language', presented to the Facultés universitaires Saint-Louis in Brussels. Here Foucault re-examines the major themes that appeared in his writing on literature from the early 1960s, referring to writers such as Bataille, Blanchot, Sade, Cervantes, Joyce, Jakobson, and others. Here Foucault locates the historical emergence of literature in its modern form from the end of the eighteenth to the early nineteenth century. His excursus proceeds, from Gutenberg's invention of printing to the emergence of the book, where, finally, "literature finds and founds its being" (p.64). What distinguishes literature is its transgressive language, "a mortal, repetitive, redoubled language, the language of the book itself" (p. 65). The third section, titled 'Lectures on Sade' comprises two lectures given in 1970 at the State University of New York at Buffalo which illustrates and adds depth to Foucault's views on literature and which also signal many of the themes that were to emerge in his later book length studies. The first lecture was on Flaubert's Bouvard and Pécuchet, the second on Sade's La Nouvelle Justine, which as the editors' note, Foucault says was written "entirely with an eye to the truth" (p. 95). What is important about this book, and these lectures and radio broadcasts, is the indication they present at an early stage of Foucault's scholarly career, of the way his analysis of literature informs and is informed by the central themes to emerge later on in his major works.

The relationship with literature constitutes a magnificent testimony, claim the editors, to understanding the way Foucault's philosophical mind-set developed, as simultaneously "critical, complex and strategic". They point out how many of these literary gestures, insights and motifs are incorporated within Foucault's great works thus rendering "fiction and poetry as touchstones of the philosophical act" (p. x). While this is by no means original or untypical amongst French philosophers (witness Bachelard, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty), Foucault, they argue, utilises such literatures (narratives, epics, poetry, comedies) to demonstrate and inform his archaeological conception of discourse in relation to "both the order of the world and its representations at a given moment" (p. x) in order to reveal "just how much our way of organising discourse about the world owe[s] to a series of historically determined divisions" (p. x). Literature, they point out, in Foucault's hands, becomes "strategic" (p. xi). On the one hand it furthers the archaeological project to enquire into the distinctiveness of the literary discourse and position it in the field of discourses. But, more than that, Foucault seeks to assess the form and function of a literary discourse to reveal the "concerted incertitude of morphology" in the sense of "a rigorous and uncontrollable polyvalence of forms" (Foucault, 1999, p. 27). This ontological thesis of radical linguistic or discursive indeterminacy which establishes the autonomy of discourse from the non-discursive is a thesis shaped by Foucault's early readings of literature. The thesis of the literary then turns out to be the thesis of discourse as autonomous, strategic, and constitutive, which as the editors say "escapes the dynasty of representation . . . which, depending on the situation, can be: inaudible, scandalous, unclassifiable, untranslatable, undecidable, fragmentary, aleatory, inconstant, vertiginous" (p. xii). Finally, literature functions as strategy in that it opposes established and settled meanings "destroying the economy of narrative, which involves the construction of a battlefield against the hegemony of meaning" (p. xii). Literature thus constitutes "the establishment of another mode of being of discourse" (p. xii).

The editors' note that by the end of the 1960s this "strange relationship to literature seemed to dissipate" (p. xii). They accept here the conventional understanding of Foucault's oeuvre as passing between distinct modalities each characterised by a different onto-epistemic figure or grounding. The early period is characterised by the priority of the discursive over non discursive practices. The order of discourse constitutes an historical determined order through which actions and relationships and practices are organised. I doubt myself whether Foucault ever really jettisoned this heuristic, although he did seek to reassert the priority of the extra-discursive material practices, or rather he endeavoured perhaps to reassert the centrality of non-discursive practices whilst not abandoning the thesis of the autonomy of the discursive. Both would be needed in order for Foucault to articulate a new model of determination about the world. This displacement of literature is a matter of record, however. As the editors say: "the gradual abandonment of the field of literature as a 'duplication' of Foucault's own research can be attributed to the desire to extend his enquiry to broader themes -- this time presented in terms of power and resistance" (pp. xii -- xiii). From the end of the 1960s it becomes apparent that "the muffled roar of battle is anything but a literary metaphor" (p. xiii).

Finally, the editors note that at the end of the 1960s, Foucault also abandoned the figure of the 'outside' and committed himself to a model of difference inside history, i.e., an 'internal history', giving rise to the question

of how we might, from within a certain epistemic and historical configuration, from within the 'network of the real' deployed by a certain economy of discourse and practice at a given moment -- in short, from within the grammar of the world as historically determined -- unearth and reverse connections, shift lines, move points, hallow out meaning, and reinvent equilibria (p. xiv).

It is this problem they state, "very clearly revealed in his work on literature, that will continue to haunt Foucault: the possible overcoming of historical determination of what we are must be conceived not in terms of a contradiction, but in terms of compossibility" (p. xiv). The extent to which we can from within history "free ourselves of those determinations [that constitute us] and paradoxically establish a space [always internal] of a different speech or a way of life" (p. xiv).

It is this last suggestion that what was central to Foucault's philosophical project as a whole, including the possible overcoming of determination in terms of compossible futures, that suggests to me that Foucault's engagement with literature saw the preparatory development and fine-tuning of what is central to his oeuvre as a whole. If so, there is an important sense in which Foucault's early engagement with literature continues to haunt even given its visible presence appears displaced by the end of the sixties. Not just parallels between the literary and madness as signifying phenomena whose infinitely flexible sign systems create spaces for secret, marginalised and chaotic discourses, but literature itself attests to the creative power of language to both traverse and transcend the social field. A space of compossibility for divergent or heterogeneous developments; for chance occurrences, or 'branchings'; these core insights that inhabit the discursive in Foucault and were developed later in more philosophical terms by Deleuze in his books on Leibniz, Hume, and Spinoza, can be clearly seen here in these early lectures and talks on Foucault's engagement with the literary.1 In his radio talk, 'Mad Language' of 1963, Foucault's constructivist ontology of language is already clear: "Words, their arbitrary encounter, their confusion, all their protoplasmic transformations are sufficient in themselves to bring into being a world that is both true and fantastic" (p. 28)

The importance of language is highlighted. Foucault said later in his interview with Claude Bonnefoy that "language is what we use to construct an absolutely infinite number of sentences and utterances" (Foucault, 2011, p. 65-6). Moreover, "the body itself . . . is like a language node" (2011, p. 26). In 'Mad Language', Foucault invokes Freud, who understood well that 'our mind was a wit' (p. 26), "a kind of master craftsman of metaphors" which "[takes] advantage of all resources, all the richness, all the poverty of our language" (p. 26).

In 'Why Did Sade Write?', the first part of Foucault's lecture given at the University of Buffalo, he 'uses' Sade to analyse, amongst other things, the role and function of writing. I will focus on this here because of the role it plays in enunciating Foucault's developing an onto-epistemic orientation that resists and escapes previous models of determination and which influences his project overall. For Foucault, writing constitutes a "principle of repeated enjoyment . . . writing will serve to erase the limitation of time . . . . it is precisely in this world of writing that temporal limits vanish" (p. 109).

Foucault demonstrates here, with reference to literature, his own relational method of holism. It is not the classical Hegelian holism of old, but one where subject and object, ideal and actual, discourse and real, are prized apart in a conception of the discursive and extra-discursive, where difference is retained within a historical variable and contingent model of unity which is now defined by the limits imposed by the material; i.e., at the limits necessary for life to sustain itself. Within this materially constituted unity, difference proliferates. Although Foucault does not utilise the concept of 'holism', as such, he does pointedly refer to Sade's concept of 'system'. As such this relational holism is articulated with reference to a concept of 'system' and to a principle of interconnectivity. Writing plays a central role alongside a similar importance for language and speech. For one role of writing "is not simply to introduce indefinite repetition . . . it is also to exceed" (p. 109). Foucault's predilection for a correct onto-epistemic orientation causes him to classify himself in the interview with Bonnefoy as a "diagnostician" (2011, p. 45). In this, he claims to follow Nietzsche for whom "philosophy was above all else a diagnosis . . . for the diseases of culture" (2011, p. 47). Foucault 'uses' Sade to elucidate these points. But the interest was no more in the author than it was in mental illness. As he argued in 'What Is an Author?' the author is a 'function' of discourse, a conception which by the end of the decade would witness the author's demise and 'death'. Foucault's own article on the author was originally couched in the context of Roland Barthes essay 'La mort de l'auteur', written in 1967. Barthes asked:

Who is speaking thus? Is it the hero of the story . . . ? Is it the individual Balzac . . . ? Is it Balzac the author . . . ? Is it universal wisdom? Romantic psychology? We shall never know, for the good reason that writing [ecriture] is the destruction of every voice, of every origin. Writing is that neutral, that composite, that oblique space where our subject slips away, the [photographic] negative where every identity is lost, starting with the identity of the very body which writes. (Barthes, 1977)

Foucault's answer was that "the author's name serves to characterize a certain mode of being of discourse . . . . The author's name manifests the appearance of a certain discursive set and indicates the status of the discourse within a society and a culture" (Foucault, 1998, p. 211).

The discourse of literature is both transgressive and singular. Through literature, Foucault establishes a new onto-epistemic orientation to space and time as real, resulting in perpetual novelty and creativity. With literary figures like Sade, Roussel or Artaud, Foucault argues that their mode of literature emerges from 'deep within them', from their "uniqueness, their particularity, their symptom, their anxiety, and finally their illness" (p. 58).

Writing constitutes a technology of repetition and multiplication, as that which 'exacerbates', 'augments', and 'multiplies without end' (p. 110). It not only opens up space; it constitutes agency and freedom:

It expresses the unlimitedness of pleasure with respect to reality, the unlimitedness of repetition with respect to time, is at the same time the unlimitedness of the image itself; it is the unlimitedness of the limit itself because all limits, one by one, are exceeded. No image is stabilized once and for all (p. 110).

So, paradoxically, the 'author function' of writing 'individuates' as socially and historically constituted individuals become differentiated within the culture structured as an open series of possibilities within a network of constraints. Writing, for Foucault, is that material activity which spatializes, individuates and alters, thus is a mechanism in history for endless creativity, novelty and uniqueness. It opens up "an infinite space before it in which images, pleasures and excess are multiplied without limit" (p. 110). Finally, says Foucault, anticipating a complexity science which was still embryonic at the time, writing renders reversibility impossible. Through writing, the subject "can no longer turn back". Such irreversibility establishes every action as potentially unique. As the post-quantum theorist might say, action within curved space/time differentiates the agent from their social and historical origins of their constitution. While Foucault came, at the end of the 1960s and after, to apply these insights with reference to the social sciences, in this book they are extracted from his analyses of literature and especially from his essay on Sade. It is Sade, we are told, who eliminates limits and introduces irregularity in an uncertain world. It is Sade who "erases the limits between the licit and the illicit, the permitted and the not permitted, of the moral and the immoral" (p. 112). It is through Sade that "writing introduces desire into the space of the indefinitely possible and always unlimited possible" (p. 112). It is Sade that conceptualizes "unique individuality". Writing establishes "the illimitability of desire and expression". Sadean literature establishes its materiality through signs that can be read, corrected and revised indefinitely, says Foucault. Finally, Sade defines four elements (God, Nature, Soul, Law) which form a 'network' or what Sade terms a 'system' (p. 139) where the elements are 'infinitely recombinable', adaptable 'like crystals', to construct discourse "absolutely specific to a situation or an individual" (p. 139), a process Sade refers to as "the irregularity of individuals": "these systems define the singularity . . . Every individual is irregular and his own irregularity is manifested, is symbolized, in his system" (p. 140)

The consequential novelty and uniqueness mean that Sade's characters "cannot be substituted for one another, cannot replace one another, and remain isolated from one another" (p. 140). It is this revised onto-epistemology that overcomes all past determinations that Foucault will project outward in his social science studies. The great contribution of this little book is that, through Sade, Foucault makes clear a revolutionary reconfiguration of the prevailing order of chance and constraint, or at least in the way it needs to be addressed. He even compares Sade's logic to that of Russell and Descartes. Constituted within history, individuals -- now -- no longer are the straightforward echoes or reflections of their cultural group or class. As Sade teaches us, systems of 'infinitely recombinable' elements can generate 'perpetual novelty': "This consists in distinguishing . . . individuals who cannot be reduced to one another, individuals who are characterized by their system, because the systems differ from individual to individual" (p. 139).

Like Leibniz's monads, in each system, the whole is refracted differently, like prisms, ensuring, as Foucault writes: "that Sade's libertines cannot be substituted for one another, cannot replace one another, and remain isolated from one another" (p. 140).

Finally, Foucault ponders as always the issue of madness and its meaning. In an interview not in this book, he told Bonnefoy at the end of the 1960s:

What astonishes me, what I keep wondering about, is how it is that a work like this which comes from an individual that a society has classified -- and consequently excluded as ill, can function, and function in a way that's absolutely positive within a culture . . . . It is this positive function of the negative that has never ceased to interest me (Foucault, 2011, p. 58 -- 59).

Foucault's Folie et Déraison had occupied his research in the years prior to these lectures and radio broadcasts, and Sade's madness is broached indirectly and a possible meaning of madness alluded to when Sade rejects all authority -- God, Nature, Law, Soul -- and has no reason to deny death.

Isn't this the greatest offence against nature -- to give up, to accept death? For nature has created us, but no sooner have we been created that it abandons us, leaving us with nothing more than the need to survive, the only trace, in a way of the gesture it made in creating us. (p. 142)

Is this what madness is? A derailment from what seems immanent to life? Is this what is being expressed in this lecture on Sade? I wish I had read these little gems years ago. It is as though they, belatedly, that is, here and now, answer a nagging question and fill in a piece of the puzzle regarding the Foucault I have been searching for all these years.


Barthes, Roland (1977) 'The Death of the Author', in Barthes, Image, Music, Text, (essays selected and translated by Stephen Heath). London: Fontana/Collins.

Foucault, Michel (2011) Speech Begins After Death, In conversation with Claude Bonnefoy, Edited by Philippe Artières, Trans. Robert Bononno, Minneapolis and London: University of Minnesota Press.

Foucault, Michel (1998) [1977] 'What Is an Author?', trans. Josué V. Harari, in James D. Faubion (ed.) Michel Foucault: Aesthetics, Method, and Epistemology (Essential Works of Foucault, 1954 -- 1984), Volume II, trans. Robert Hurley and others, London: Allen Lane/Penguin Press, pp. 205 -- 222.

1 An affinity can be noted in relation to historical determination and compossibility between this position of Foucault as noted by the editors, and Deleuze's notes in Cinema II, drawing on Jorge Luis Borges, that as Leibniz postulated, contradictions that can co-exist and that "several mutually incompatible worlds do in fact exist" (p. xiv).