Law and Evil: Philosophy, Politics, Psychoanalysis

Placeholder book cover

Ari Hirvonen and Janne Porttikivi (eds.), Law and Evil: Philosophy, Politics, Psychoanalysis, Routledge, 2010, 308pp., $115.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415497916.

Reviewed by Bob Vallier, DePaul University



There has been a flurry of publications in the last decade from philosophers, social psychologists, political theorists, sociologists, and of course, theologians of various backgrounds concerning the problem of evil. One might account for a recent uptick in interest in reflecting on this question by pointing to both the “high-profile” cases of evil, such as 9-11, Abu Ghraib, Darfur, or the sex abuse scandal in the Catholic church, as well as the endless “anonymous” cases of human beings’ constant and cruel inhumanity to their fellow beings, human and otherwise, distressingly far too numerous to name. But citing empirical causes would be far too easy, because the truth is, the problem of evil has never gone away. In the long epoch of metaphysics, its meaning and scope was more narrowly defined, perhaps univocal, but today the “problem of evil” is a bit of a portmanteau. No longer cast in the framework of a theodicy, evil is a distinctly human problem, understood variously as moral character, action, or consequence, and through guises such as atrocity, wickedness, sin, irrational hatred, terrorism, and crimes against humanity, to name but a few. We may no longer think it as incarnated in Smoke Monsters (sorry, fellow LOST fans), but Enlightenment has hardly cured us of the problem of evil, and Hannah Arendt was prescient when she said that “the problem of evil will be the fundamental question of post-war intellectual life in Europe.”

So there may well be renewed interest in the problem of evil, but the problem itself is hardly new. It is as old as philosophy itself, a discourse which begins, one story goes, with an act of spiritual freedom that allows the first philosopher to step away from the naïve comfort of the bosom of nature and ask “why?” The conditions for the possibility of evil are established with this first act of freedom, and indeed, freedom may itself be the first act of evil, in that it commits a violence against nature, violates nature by turning it into an object for scientific inquiry and for instrumental reason. The co-originarity of freedom and evil (arguably what Kant meant by “radical evil”) born of our willful separation from nature (as Schelling claims) is not only a philosophical mirror of the theological story of the Fall, but also and more importantly accounts for why the problem of evil will not go away: as long as we are free, there is evil — not simply as a possibility, but as actuality. Kant, of course, is responding to Leibniz’s notion of Theodicy, itself articulated against Bayle’s skeptical argument against the goodness of God. Long after Kant’s response, Nietzsche, Freud, Arendt, and others will tell a different story about evil that takes us definitively beyond its metaphysical confines.

There are a few excellent texts among those recently published that provide a superb narrative framework for understanding the problem of evil. Reflections on evil prior to Theodicy (that is, prior to the debate between Bayle and Leibniz) typically remain the purview of theology and religious studies. But among the philosophers, Susan Neiman’s magisterial study demonstrates how the debate over Theodicy informs the development of modern philosophy and the experience of modernity. Richard Bernstein covers all the major bases, from German Idealism (Kant, Hegel, Schelling), thorough social psychology (Nietzsche, Freud), to more contemporary philosophers (Levinas, Jonas, Arendt). Lars Svendsen’s recent book offers a taxonomy of evils and considers how philosophers respond to them, while Claudia Card’s study treats evil as an ethical problem and suffering and harm as a necessary consequence, then sketches an “atrocity theory,” between stoicism and utilitarianism, in order to take account of the most significant evils of the twentieth century, just as Leibniz had to take account of the Lisbon earthquake. Most collections of philosophical essays on the topic cover the same swath of philosophical history, focus on the usual philosophers, and approach the issue from what I hesitatingly call an “Anglo-American” philosophical perspective (as I wish neither to mischaracterize nor overdetermine the scholarly orientations of the contributuors, nor be perceived as making an ad hominem). “Continental” philosophers have not abundantly published on the topic, though a couple of noteworthy exceptions are Martin Matustik’s post-secular meditation on evil and hope, and Alan Schrift’s collection of essays on modernity and evil. There are precious few collections from a psychoanalytic perspective, and even fewer from the domain of critical legal studies. This is what makes the collection entitled Law and Evil: Philosophy, Politics, Psychoanalysis, edited by Ari Hirvonen and Janne Prottikivi, a different, valuable, and welcome addition: it tries to respond to these lacks in the literature on the problem of evil in a single volume.

The editors’ introduction is alone a valuable piece, ably surveying more than a decade’s worth of reflection on the problem of evil from different academic domains and in different languages. Justifying the collection with the (somewhat unfair) claim that evil is a concept too often taken as self-evident, as already defined or understood, or as a relic of the bygone era of ontotheology, the editors bring together essays that try to “give richer and more thoroughgoing analysis of the multifaceted phenomenon of evil in its ethical, political, and philosophical ramifications” (p. 5). The fourteen essays in the collection are shared out into three sections, synonymously corresponding to the domains named in the book’s subtitle. On a critical note, the sections sometimes feel artificially composed, as if the essays do not naturally belong together or complement each other (this is especially true in the second section, on “Terror”). Some essays feel as if they were included rather arbitrarily (Françoise Dastur’s and Simon Critchley’s essays, for example, are both excellent, but feel at first to have but an incidental relation to the collection’s thematic, and Dastur’s is rather turgidly translated). Some essays are more obfuscating than clarifying, or assume too much specialized knowledge without adding any illuminating context (hence a whiff of hermetic scholasticism). But we must remember that this is an edited collection of essays, and the problems I just mentioned are not uncommon to such compendia. While I wouldn’t count it as a demerit, I do wish there was greater narrative cohesiveness in this case, if only because the topic is so rich and the explorations so varied. On the other hand, the essays do raise interest in various aspects of the problem of evil in sometimes unexpected ways, and if one of the tests for a good collection is that it makes the reader want to pursue the topic further in dialogue with other writers, then this passes.

The first part of the book, “Freedom,” concerns the philosophical approach to the problem of evil focusing on freedom as that which “interrupts” the quiet bliss of wholeness or oneness with nature, casting us out of Eden (Angus McDonald) and forming the basis of tragic poetry (Dastur). Marcia Sá Cavalcante Schuback’s article is an especially noteworthy contribution — scholarly, insightful, and eminently readable — focusing on Schelling and Heidegger, connecting the problem of evil to the ambiguity of human life. The editors here also include contributions inspired by contemporary French philosophy. As I am not a connoisseur of the work of Jean-Luc Nancy, I found Sami Santanen’s piece on wickedness in Nancy difficult to follow; Jari Kauffinen’s essay on “Derrida’s philosophy explained through the concept of evil” fares a bit better, but its promising thesis is perhaps too ambitious in its scope. I’m not sure that Derrida’s philosophy is “explained,” but the author does show that the elements for a deconstruction of radical evil are, in different guises, to be found throughout Derrida’s work, and I found myself frequently writing in the margins of this essay.

The second part of the book, on “Terror,” concerns political manifestations of evils. After a critical review of Arendt on the banality of evil (Jacob Rogozinski), Critchley’s essay on “The Catechism of the Citizen” takes up citizenship as the means to cultivate moral and civic virtue, and thus temper the corrupt and evil passions. But as Hirvonen’s piece, a solid example of critical legal scholarship, shows, citizenship itself, as a function of the law, can itself be utterly infected with evil, as he evinces through a frightening catalogue of the laws, legislation, and legal frameworks of the Third Reich (more than any other, I think this essay shows why the titular terms “Law” and “Evil” belong together and why our vigilance with regard to the law must never wane). Artemy Magun’s essay further erodes the Rousseauist naiveté by showing that if the Enlightenment subject is governed by self-mastery, then contemporary terrorism is the legacy of a crisis of autonomy, which he teases out through a reading of The Dispossessed.

The final part of the book, “Desire,” is devoted to psychoanalytic readings of law and evil. The first two essays are of a Lacanian-Žižekian inspiration, for which, it must be said, I have little patience, but each offers a critical perspective on Kantian morality that refers the reader back to the earlier essays. The third essay is an interesting clinical perspective focusing, sometimes in very technical ways, on perversion, psychopathy, and their regulation. But the fourth essay by Véronique Voruz deserves special mention for its clarity of exposition of the Freudian death drive and Lacan’s interpretation of it, focusing on “Kant with Sade,” and revaluing the categorical imperative as a philosophical rationalization of moral masochism. Of all the essays in the volume, this one is the most clear, accessible, and instructive, virtues that many other essays regrettably do not possess.

On the whole, this is an interesting but uneven collection, approaching the problem of evil from three distinct but complementary discursive positions. Many of the essays are clear and insightful, but many others are highly specialized and obfuscating. Still, there’s a little something here for everybody, and even those for whom the problem of evil is not an area of specialization will benefit from essays in this collection. At the very least, readers will find themselves engaged in a critical dialogue, and will perhaps rediscover, as I did, the problem of evil through a pluridisciplinary optic. Indeed, “the problem of evil” names a large and diverse field of inquiry, to which many voices from different disciplines will continue to contribute, and the greatest virtue of this book is that it opens new avenues of dialogue to this rich and inexhaustible questioning of evil. It will be a valuable addition to the University library.