Laws & Lawmakers: Science, Metaphysics, and the Laws of Nature

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Marc Lange, Laws & Lawmakers: Science, Metaphysics, and the Laws of Nature, Oxford University Press, 2009, 257pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195328141.

Reviewed by Ned Hall, Harvard University


This book presents a compact yet thorough exposition and defense of an important position about the metaphysics of natural laws. The level of philosophical argumentation is consistently high, and while the dialectic gets quite intricate at times, Lange more than compensates by writing in a lucid and thoroughly engaging manner. I found it to be a model of the kind of metaphysical inquiry that pays very close attention to science and scientific practice -- with a particular emphasis on physics -- while reserving a quite substantial role for purely philosophical methods of investigation. I think it's a must read, for anyone interested in the nature of natural laws.

It is also remarkably bold, in a way that is bound to raise eyebrows among those familiar with the literature in this area. For Lange's key move is to insist that we should understand what it is for something to be a law of nature, and what natural necessity is, in terms of counterfactuals and the "subjunctive facts" (his expression) that they express. This move will strike many philosophers as exactly the wrong way around: for don't we know by now that counterfactuals are so slippery, context-sensitive, and generally semantically ill-behaved that they are no good for analyzing anything unless strictly and severely regimented? And don't we know that, in order to effect the proper kind of regimentation, we need to appeal to such concepts as "law of nature", or closely related notions such as "cause"? (As an example of an area where this philosophical orientation is particularly prominent, consider counterfactual analyses of causation.) I will put my cards on the table: yes, I think we do know these things, and that Lange's contrary viewpoint is, at the end of the day, mistaken. But his case for it is so interesting and well thought out that it still deserves to be placed among the leading contenders -- alongside, for example, the Lewisian best system analysis or Tim Maudlin's recent defense of primitivism about laws.

I will now march through the book's four chapters, highlighting the major points of interest; I will then sketch what I think are the most important criticisms of Lange's "counterfactuals first" approach.

Let me set the stage by making some simplifying assumptions. First, I will elide the difference between "would" and "might" counterfactuals, treating as equivalent the constructions "had A been the case, then B would have been the case" and "had A been the case, then B might have been the case". Second, I will treat as unproblematic a distinction between non-nomic (for Lange: "sub-nomic") propositions and the rest. Third, I will take propositions simply to be sets of possible worlds. Lange makes none of these assumptions -- and as a result his discussion is both more ecumenical and more nuanced. But no harm will come from their use in this sketch. There is one more simplifying assumption -- which, again, Lange scrupulously avoids: for the moment, let's pretend that the counterfactual construction itself injects no context sensitivity into sentences in which it features. Understandably, we'll suspend that assumption when it comes time to explore the difficulties for Lange's approach.

The first of the book's four chapters lays out Lange's crucial move, which given our assumptions can be set forth in this way: Let S be the set of worlds compatible with the laws of nature. Then, for any sub-nomic propositions p, q, r, . . . , all compatible with S, the following counterfactuals are true:


 (q  S)

 (q  (r  S))

. . .

Lange offers this principle not only as a sharp articulation of the familiar idea that laws somehow "support" counterfactuals, but as the linchpin of an account of what makes something a law.

How so? First, observe that in the statement of the principle, we can abstract away any mention of laws, as follows: A set of worlds S is sub-nomically stable just in case, for any sub-nomic propositions p, q, r, . . . , all compatible with S, the following counterfactuals are true:


 (q  S)

 (q  (r  S))

. . .

And now we can say, without any threat of circularity, that the nomological possibilities -- that is, the worlds compatible with the laws of nature -- form a sub-nomically stable set of worlds. (The reason for including nested counterfactuals is to capture the idea that the laws would still have been laws, had conditions compatible with them obtained; these added clauses also come into play late in the book, when Lange explores what it is that bestows necessity on the laws.)

Now, it is surely not the only such set: for example, the set of all logically possible worlds is sub-nomically stable, as is the set containing just the actual world (barring some lingering worries about centering, the principle that for any true proposition P, the "closest" P-world to the actual world is the actual world itself). And, just maybe, there are interesting examples intermediate between the logical and nomological possibilities: pretending for the moment that ours is a Newtonian world complete with specific force laws, perhaps the set of worlds that conforms to our world's conservation laws (whether or not they conform to those force laws) is itself sub-nomically stable. (Lange thinks so.)

Why suppose -- as I just did, implicitly -- that if two distinct sets of worlds are both sub-nomically stable, then one is nested inside the other? Because we have to, as a lovely little proof of Lange's demonstrates. Adapted to our assumptions, it proceeds as follows: suppose for reductio that S and T are both sub-nomically stable, but that there are S-worlds not in T and T-worlds not in S. Then let A be the proposition that is true exactly in these two sorts of worlds. By the stability of S, A  ¬T. By the stability of T, A  T. And that's a contradiction.

So -- provided that there are stable sets intermediate between the actual world and the set of all logically possible worlds, and provided that there is a unique smallest such set short of the actual world -- then the smallest set will count as yielding the laws of nature, as the propositions true in every member of it. But we get an added bonus: some laws of nature may turn out to possess a stronger species of necessity than others, namely, if they hold true in every member of some more comprehensive stable set. Again, Lange proposes that in just this way the necessity that attaches to the conservation laws is stronger than the necessity that attaches to the force laws.

Chapter 2 approaches the same ideas from a different direction, beginning with an investigation into what exactly it is for something to count as a species of genuine necessity. Lange develops a persuasive case that the very sort of stability that properly captured the connection between laws and counterfactuals also allows us to answer this question.  For if we begin with the intuitive idea that to say of some true proposition that it is not only true but necessary is to say that this proposition would still have held, no matter what -- and if we are careful to circumscribe, in a principled way, the possibilities included in this "no matter what" clause so as not to render this principle trivially false -- then we arrive exactly at the idea that the genuine necessities correspond to stable sets. Along the way, Lange raises what he calls a "Euthyphro" question about laws and necessity: Are laws necessary because they are laws? Or is it rather that they are laws because they are necessary? With his account of necessity in hand, he is in a position to adopt the latter position.

The picture that emerges, then, is this: what it is to be a law is to possess a species of genuine necessity. What it is to possess a species of genuine necessity is to be true in every world of some sub-nomically stable set of worlds. And finally -- skipping ahead now to chapter 4, and switching to Lange's preferred idiom, according to which it is logically closed sets of truths that count as stable, and not sets of worlds -- what makes it the case that a certain set of truths is sub-nomically stable is that certain subjunctive facts obtain. And these facts are to be treated asontologically primitive. Chapter 4 forthrightly recognizes that this sort of primitivism will strike many as extravagant, but defends it principally by arguing that no other view can do proper justice to the intimate relationship between lawhood and necessity.

The first, second, and fourth chapters thus contain the principle exposition and defense of Lange's view. The third chapter serves as a kind of interlude and auxiliary support, aiming to put on display what Lange takes to be three valuable consequences of his account. First, he argues that his account explains why the laws of nature cannot change over time. (It's worth observing that his reasoning applies equally to the claim that they cannot change from place to place.) Second, he argues that once we have the apparatus in place to say precisely what we mean by a nomic truth, we can apply the concept of stability to collections of both nomic and sub-nomic truths, thereby yielding a precise sense in which there can be meta-laws governing the first-order laws. Lange makes an interesting case that symmetry principles in physics are just these sorts of meta-laws. (This, by the way, is one example of many where his discussion makes useful and illuminating contact with scientific practice.) And third, he shows how his account easily yields a consequence that, he thinks, remains mysterious on other accounts: namely, that a statement of the form "it is a law that p" must contradict a statement to the effect that p has some non-zero chance of failing to obtain.

That concludes our (necessarily selective) tour. Let me close by explaining why, despite the really impressive ingenuity Lange displays in defending his approach, I remain unconvinced. Part of the reason -- the lesser part, really -- is that Lange overplays the problems for rival accounts, principally because he underestimates the wide gaps between what he takes to be proper targets for philosophical explanation and what certain of his opponents do. For example, he complains about the best system account that it cannot properly do justice to the intuitive idea that if something is a law, then it possesses a kind of genuine necessity. No surprise: those who defended the best system account do so precisely because they want an account of how laws function in scientific practice that does away with any suggestion that the truths about our world come in metaphysically different kinds. And this difference in viewpoint traces, I think, to an even more fundamental difference of opinion over what counts as genuine scientific understanding of some phenomenon.

On one view, to understand some phenomenon is, at least in part, to acquire some knowledge about what that phenomenon genuinely depends on, where it is natural to think that such relations of explanatory dependence must ultimately be grounded in real necessities in nature. Lange clearly belongs to this camp. But on the rival view, understanding is really targeted at a whole range of phenomena and is achieved once one has seen how to organize one's view of these phenomena in a cognitively effective manner; this, I think, is the guiding idea behind so-called "unificationist" approaches to explanation. Adopt this latter view about understanding and explanation and you will think that the only useful truths to pick out by the term "law" are those truths knowledge of which allows one to achieve the most unified, well organized view of our world possible. Agreed: laws are incredibly important to explanation -- indispensable to it, really. But the way that they are indispensable leads straight to something like the best system account, and not to an account that would seek to invest them with some kind of genuine necessity.

There are several other places where I think Lange is a bit unfair to the opposition, but let me turn to the more critical worries, which concern his assumptions about how counterfactuals function and whether it is really kosher to help oneself to ontologically primitive "subjunctive facts". Before, I pretended that the counterfactual construction adds no context sensitivity to sentences that feature it. Lange makes no such mistake; he is perfectly aware that one and the same counterfactual sentence can, in different contexts, express different propositions. It is unclear, however, just why this should be so, on his view. Compare: any of a number of semantic treatments of counterfactuals currently on offer will lay out truth-conditions for them which make it abundantly evident why they should be context-sensitive. But these treatments invariably give a central role to laws, something Lange cannot abide. It is not clear what alternative treatment he has in mind.

Setting this problem aside, we can ask how, given the context-sensitivity of counterfactuals, we can say what it is for a certain set of truths to be stable. Lange's answer: simply quantify over all contexts. So, put in the possible worlds idiom, and ignoring the complexities involved in nesting the counterfactuals, the definition of stability becomes this: a set of worlds S is sub-nomically stable just in case, for any sub-nomic proposition p compatible with S, p  S is true with respect to every possible context.

But Lange's optimism that the laws of nature meet such a stringent condition seems to be misplaced. God does not exist, let us stipulate; but if she had, she might occasionally have intervened in the normal operations of nature in ways that we could call "miracles" -- meaning thereby not violations of the laws of nature (that's a contradiction), but violations of the principles that the laws say govern the operation of the world, absent God's interference. With that terminology in place, we can now observe that the following counterfactual is surely true, in some contexts: if Jesus had walked on water, there would have been a miracle. But its antecedent does not contradict the actual laws of nature, since there are ways that the water molecules under Jesus's feet could have been moving -- astronomically unlikely ways, to be sure, but nomologically possible for all that -- which would have guaranteed that he succeeded in his efforts to walk on the water.

Once you see the trick, it's routine to generate cases like this: just take an antecedent that could be made true under the actual laws only if some absurdly unlikely coincidence had obtained in the relevant boundary conditions, but that could also have been made true if the laws had been different in some relatively obvious way. Lange's account of stability requires that there be no context whatsoever where, when such a counterfactual is in play, the contextual pressures would tip the balance in favor of taking the laws to be different in the proffered counterfactual situation. This strikes me as not at all plausible, and at any rate one of the rare places in which the book falls argumentatively short is in offering very little by way of reasons for thinking that, for example, we're making a mistake when we judge (as I do) the Jesus counterfactual to be true in many contexts.

Note, in addition, that it would serve Lange's purposes poorly to amend the definition of stability so as to restrict which contexts are the appropriate ones. In the first place, it's not clear how such a restriction could be stated without appealing in some way to the notion of law. But in the second place, he takes full advantage of the flexibility in choosing different contexts when arguing (in chapter 1) that no set of truths that contained some but not all accidental truths could be sub-nomically stable. For, he asserts, suppose such a set was stable. Then consider some accidental truth p included in the set and some other accidental truth q not included in the set. Lange claims that there must be contexts in which the conditional (¬p v ¬q)  ¬p is true -- since there can be no grounds for thinking that the first accidental truth must always take precedence over the second in being held fixed in the counterfactual situation that denies that bothare true. So here it matters crucially that we're allowed to consider an arbitrarily wide range of contexts. But he baldly asserts that when an accidental truth is pitted against a law -- as it is in the Jesus counterfactual -- the law wins:

The argument that I have just given against the stability of any nonmaximal set Γ containing accidents cannot be used against Λ's stability. [Λ = the set of truths that are laws.] Although context wields great influence over counterfactuals, there is a limit to its influence: in no context does an accident q take priority over a law p under the counterfactual supposition (¬p or ¬q). (p. 35)

The case for this crucial claim is never made adequately.

We should also worry, I think, over an approach whose key primitives -- subjunctive facts -- cannot, by its own lights, be picked out in a determinate and unambiguous fashion by any linguistic means at our disposal. Consider the expression "the fact that if it had rained on the morning of Sept. 11, 2011, in Ned's front yard, the ground in that location would have been wet later that day." Presumably, this expression does not pick out the same subjunctive fact relative to every context. So we should think of it as corresponding to a set of subjunctive facts: the set of facts p such that for some context C, this expression picks out p relative to C. Fine. But are there any systematic connections between these facts? Does the given set possess any interesting sort of ontological unity? I have no idea how to answer these questions, on Lange's approach. By contrast, an approach that explicitly analyzes counterfactuals in terms of laws, introducing context-variable parameters, raises no such issues.

Indeed, these worries about the nature of subjunctive facts appear to extend to even more basic matters, e.g., this one: What is it about the nature of any of the subjunctive facts expressed (in some context) by a sentence of the form "A  B" that guarantees that, if such a fact obtains, and if in addition the fact expressed by "A" obtains, then the fact expressed by "B" obtains? I do not say that by taking subjunctive facts to be ontologically primitive, Lange has ruled out the possibility of an illuminating answer to this question. But it would go some way toward easing the queasiness many of us feel at taking subjunctive facts to be analytical primitives if he could elucidate their structure sufficiently that the answer was obvious.