Laws of Nature

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Walter Ott and Lydia Patton (eds.), Laws of Nature, Oxford University Press, 2018, 264pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198746775.

Reviewed by Heather Demarest, University of Colorado, Boulder


This book is a collection of interesting papers edited by Walter Ott and Lydia Patton. It fills an oft-noted gap in the laws literature: namely, connecting familiar contemporary accounts to their early modern predecessors. Chapters one through six describe and evaluate several different notions of laws that appear in early modern history and explore how those transformed into contemporary notions. Chapters seven through twelve address familiar topics in current laws literature. The first half of the book provides an excellent backdrop for contemporary debates while the second half of the book advances those debates. Readers will benefit from the rich and suggestive connections developed in these pages.

Ott and Patton begin the book by historically situating the current discussion on laws, uncovering assumptions from Descartes through the empiricists. Importantly, Ott and Patton show the ways in which commonly held intuitions and assumptions have changed over time, arguing that they are more malleable than many contemporary philosophers realize. Crucially, "[These intuitions] do not automatically deserve a place in our theorizing about laws; each must live or die on its own merits." (3) They trace the origin of contingent, top-down governance intuitions (something that later appears in Dretske-Tooley-Armstrong and Maudlin accounts) to Descartes and the voluntarist dictates of an all-powerful, occasionalist god. They go on to explore the roots of explanation, prediction, and universality. Interestingly, they argue that it was Berkeley, not Hume, who presaged the Mill-Ramsey-Lewis best system accounts, since Berkeley defended the idea that the laws were theorems from which regularities could be deduced, while Hume thought laws were simply the regularities themselves. They show how different combinations of powers and inert properties can mesh with different accounts of law, claiming, "nothing prevents the powers theorist from hijacking a Best Systems Analysis and yoking it to her own ontology," (16) a view with which I am sympathetic and work to develop elsewhere.

Helen Hattab argues that the three distinctive features of Descartes' notion of law -- laws as universal, causal, and determinative -- differ in crucial ways from the scholastic conception arising from the Thomist tradition of Aristotle and Aquinas. Nevertheless, for Descartes, as well as for some earlier authors (such as Piccolomini and Basso), the laws of nature continue to appeal to divine influence. Whereas the scholastics believed that order in nature comes from hierarchical, teleological powers imbued by providence, Descartes rejects powers, hierarchy, and teleology, yet argues that the laws that impose order on nature follow from God's immutability. Hattab's chapter nicely illustrates the nuanced and complicated ways in which these early modern writers differed from and influenced one another.

Mary Domski has an excellent chapter showing how the different epistemological approaches of Descartes and Newton influenced their views of the laws. Both were religious and believed God to be ultimately responsible for the order in nature, and both also believed that humans were finite and could never truly comprehend the infinite-divine. Interestingly, these commitments took them in very different directions. Descartes, a rationalist, believed we could obtain certain knowledge of the laws of nature by clear and distinct knowledge of God (e.g., God's immutability), whose perfections we know with more certainty than anything else. Newton, by contrast, an empiricist, argued that we could never know the mind of God, and so experiments were the only way to learn the laws of nature. However, Domski argues -- against Alan Shapiro and Roger Cotes -- that Newton had a "two-step" approach. First, he reasoned mathematically, achieving certain knowledge of the axioms or primary laws. Then, Domski notes that Newton was also a voluntarist -- he believed God could freely choose which laws to instantiate. Thus, she argues that in Newton's second step, empirical investigation was required to establish whether those axioms were true -- whether they actually obtained for the phenomena of the world.

Ott argues that there are original and distinct accounts of laws found in the work of both Francis Bacon and Spinoza. Both of these accounts reject the inert properties found in Descartes, but also reject the profusion of powers and forms found in the scholastics. Bacon, for instance, defended a view that reduced the number of powerful properties, and that posited 'bottom-up' governance, with laws of nature that served to differentiate the powers. Spinoza, who also believed in powers, took the laws to be nothing over and above the powers. Ott argues that according to Spinoza, "talking of laws or rules is just talking of powers or dispositions." (75) If we take the law metaphor at face value, Ott thinks that Descartes focused on the top-down, arbitrary lawmaker, whose dictates must be followed, while Bacon and Spinoza focused on the statutes, which describe what must happen in any particular case, where different powers may compete against one another. This chapter provides an excellent historical backdrop for the powers approach defended by Mumford in chapter 11.

Seventeenth century philosophers rejected the powers ontology of the scholastics. Stathis Psillos uncovers four different motivations: we cannot observe powers; we cannot know about powers; there is no directedness from one power to another; and there is no mechanism by which powers can push, pull, or modify one another. The solution for many early modern philosophers (Psillos discusses several) is a powerful God, who can enforce laws of nature. For Malebranche, "The laws are the divine decrees themselves, which ground the regularity." (93) For Berkeley, God causes our ideas via exceptionless rules that we call 'laws of nature.' Echoing the idea that Berkeley defended a best system version of the laws, Psillos argues that for Berkeley, "Laws of nature, then, 'replace' internal principles of motion of bodies. In science it is enough to state true theorems about the motion of the bodies, irrespective of what might or might not cause these motions. These true theorems are 'the rules and laws of motion' and the 'theorems deduced from them'." (97) Psillos shows how God plays slightly different (though central) roles for Descartes, Leibniz, and Newton.

Angela Breitenbach delves into the complexity of Kant's account of laws. "According to Kant, all natural phenomena are without exception unified by a set of a priori laws . . . The necessity they express is not given independently in the objects themselves, but it is grounded in the nature of the human intellect." (108) For Kant, there are a priori general laws. We use these to guide empirical inquiry into systematically unified, a posteriori, specific laws. Breitenbach connects these Kantian ideas to contemporary accounts found in Kitcher, Friedman, and Patton.

The second half of the book begins with a paper by John W. Carroll. First, he presents his account of laws -- regularities that are made true by nature, or because nature is the way it is. He claims this account accommodates a robust notion of governing by, "Constituting what it is for the laws to be enforced [which] is not the same as enforcing the laws." (127) While there wasn't enough space in the chapter for Carroll to fully explain or defend this account, Carroll goes on to develop a contextual semantics for law statements that is independently interesting and worth exploration. Carroll develops his contextual semantics to help Humeans address a common objection. The objection is that counterfactuals go wrong in worlds such as Carroll's mirror worlds. The objection arises because, intuitively, two worlds can match perfectly yet have different laws and thus different counterfactuals -- something Humeans (given supervenience) must deny. Carroll's contextual semantics allows for contradictory counterfactuals to be true of one world in different contexts. I think this is a powerful response and am happy to see it developed with Carroll's careful attention to linguistics.

Michela Massimi's chapter adds to the growing literature that supplements, or reformulates, the best system analysis (BSA) of laws. Her paper nicely bridges the historical-contemporary divide by showing the ways in which scientific laws, such as the conservation of mass, have changed over time. She argues we ought to think of simplicity and strength -- and even the balance between them -- as something that is perspectival, varying from one scientific community to another. The connections she draws between actual, historical examples and criteria for theory selection are interesting, particularly since many contemporary theorists are happy to incorporate subjective criteria into the BSA. Given the wide variety of criteria that scientists claim to use in theory selection, it would be nice to see more work on whether the historical notions that Massimi identifies as simplicity and strength are really other ways of thinking about simplicity and strength, or whether they are different criteria altogether. For one example, she claims that simplicity in Newton's time should be, "understood as 'true and sufficient causes' for phenomena." (154-155) In any case, Massimi certainly shows how the historical notions guiding theory selection may not be easily translatable into the notions of simplicity and strength, as understood by contemporary BSA theorists. A popular move in the contemporary debates on laws is to claim that one's preferred metaphysical account of laws best captures actual, scientific practice. Massimi's chapter is a powerful reminder that different scientific communities may not share the same standards. Massimi's solution is to make the metaphysical account of laws relative to these communities; however, I imagine others will prefer to reject those early modern standards in favor of contemporary ones.

James Woodward criticizes the contemporary debate on laws of nature for engaging in a search for reductive truthmakers -- a search that he thinks is futile. Though he canvasses several objections, his main complaint, perhaps unsurprisingly, is that contemporary accounts fail to recognize the importance of invariance. In the spirit of Eugene Wigner (whom he cites at length) and Ned Hall, Woodward emphasizes the distinction between a system's initial conditions -- which are ideally random, or disordered -- and its predictable evolution -- which is ideally ordered. He argues that the main role of a law of nature is to allow for as many different initial conditions as possible, and to show how those conditions evolve according to uniform, general principles that are as constrained as possible. These notions are inherently and, he claims, unproblematically modal. His rough formulation of invariance is: "generalization G is invariant if it would continue to hold were certain changes in initial conditions to hold." (169) Woodward goes on to show the ways in which his account is similar to Marc Lange's account, to the BSA, and to dispositional and necessitation accounts of laws, though he argues that those accounts are good only to the extent that they are disguised invariance accounts.

Lange argues that many good scientific explanations appeal to reducible properties. For instance, the fact that a see-saw's right-sided mass times distance, minus its left-sided mass times distance is greater than zero helps explain why the see-saw tips right. Lange argues for why logically equivalent (or entailed) sentences do not have the same explanatory power. He also argues that these explanations need not be causal. Lange develops an interesting connection between the naturalness of reducible properties (P) and the laws (L): "P is natural enough to explain if and only if there is an explanation of L in which P (that is to say, the combination of properties to which it reduces) enters as a unit." (196) He provides a number of variations on the see-saw case to illustrate exactly when reducible properties appear as units, rather than as convoluted, mathematically equivalent entities, and concedes that this distinction is likely one of degree rather than kind.

Stephen Mumford attempts to resolve the intuitive conflict between exceptionless laws of nature and the many, actual exceptions to them. Standardly, this is attempted by appealing to ceteris paribus clauses. To avoid the specter of triviality, Mumford appeals to dispositions. He argues, in a neo-Thomist spirit, and following Schrenk, that law statements do not capture exceptionless regularities, but rather, exceptionless dispositions that often compete against one another. Thus, there are no exceptions to the dispositions themselves, but only to their manifestations -- which occur (or not) with varying strengths, depending on what other dispositions are around. While Mumford claims this yields "something less than necessity, but . . . more than pure contingency," I am skeptical that, as he claims, "we have good reason to believe, [this kind of modality] is "irreducible to the two established modal values of possibility -- or pure contingency -- and necessity." (214) One question for Mumford is whether, given a complete arrangement of non-probabilistic dispositions at a time, there can be any remaining 'contingency.' It seems plausible on his account that the answer is 'no.' Thus, it would seem that this 'middle ground' only exists when one has not fully specified the relevant dispositions.

The book concludes with Nancy Cartwright and Pedro Merlussi's chapter on laws and contingencies. They argue that three popular accounts of laws -- the Humean best system analysis, necessitation between universals, and dispositional accounts -- leave open the possibility of some kind of contingency. A law allows for contingency in five ways: extent (the laws are silent about the occurrence of some events), permissiveness (the laws allow that two different events may occur but give no probabilities), reliability (the laws are sometimes wrong about what occurs), potency (the laws make events happen), and free will (if someone does P, they could have done ~P). Most significantly, they argue that all three types of laws may not have universal extent, which means the nature of the laws, by itself, won't guarantee a fully deterministic (or probabilistic) world. They point out that non-contingency can be added to any account of laws, but they argue, "in all senses of 'laws' surveyed that is just what these are: add-ons." (243)

The chapters of this book offer focused insights on a variety of topics concerning the laws of nature. No doubt different readers will find different chapters more relevant to their own research, but each chapter provides something valuable, and taken together, they serve to remind the reader of the surprising breadth, depth, and history of the laws of nature literature.