Lectures on the Philosophy of Art: The Hotho Transcript of the 1823 Berlin Lectures

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G. F. W. Hegel, Lectures on the Philosophy of Art: The Hotho Transcript of the 1823 Berlin Lectures, Robert F. Brown (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2014, 508pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199694822.

Reviewed by Allen Speight, Boston University


Over the last forty years in the Anglophone philosophical world, the face of Hegel's aesthetics has been a sprawling two-volume work of almost 1300 pages, Hegel's Aesthetics: Lectures on Fine Art, the product of the venerable Scottish Hegel scholar and translator Sir Thomas Malcolm Knox (1900-1980). With a frontispiece featuring a photograph of the classic sculpture Silenus with the Infant Bacchus (the "Munich Faun" in the possession of Munich's Staatliche Antikensammlungen und Glyptothek, which is commented upon in the section on "the beauty of art or the ideal"), this translation's contours have become familiar to many of Hegel's English-language readers.

Beneath that imposing façade, however, much philosophical and historico-critical discussion has ranged over the textual status of the German work on which Knox's translation rests -- a work that (unlike the Phenomenology of Spirit, the Encyclopedia, the Science of Logic and the Philosophy of Right) was not written and published by Hegel himself. The Aesthetics translates instead a three-volume compilation of Hegel's lectures on aesthetics edited and published after the philosopher's 1831 death by his student Heinrich Gustav Hotho (1802-1873). Hotho, who took over Hegel's lectures on aesthetics in Berlin, published his edition of Hegel's Aesthetics lectures first in 1835 and in a second edition in 1842 (the latter of which Knox used as the basis of his translation).

Hotho had himself attended two of the four Berlin lecture series that Hegel gave on this topic (the 1823 and 1826 series) and had access, among other things, both to Hegel's own notebooks on aesthetics and to transcripts of other series made by students and auditors. Although Hegel's own notebooks have, sadly, disappeared since Hotho's time, a number of the transcripts upon which Hotho drew -- including one of the two made by Hotho himself when he attended Hegel's lectures -- still exist, and German editions of most of these (excluding, however, quite crucially, those from the final series that Hegel gave in 1828-9) have been published over the last couple of decades by Professor Gethmann-Siefert and other scholars associated with the Hegel-Archive in Bochum, Germany.

The present volume is a translation of Annemarie Gethmann-Siefert's 1998 Meiner Verlag critical edition of the 1823 transcript made by Hotho himself (Vorlesungen über die Philosophie der Kunst. Berlin 1823. Nachgeschrieben von Heinrich Gustav Hotho), together with Gethmann-Siefert's introduction to that edition. Its appearance in English translation -- heralding a wider audience for the scholarly debates that have raged about the status of Hegel's lectures -- raises the question of what will be the new face of Hegel's aesthetics for the next few decades.

Gethmann-Siefert's thesis, by now familiar to most who work in this area, is that Hotho -- who had substantial interests of his own in aesthetics and published several works in this area over the 19th century -- brought unfortunately the heaviest of editorial hands to his work on Hegel's aesthetics. Her comparison of the invariably sparser text of the "lectures" (what was recorded by various of Hegel's students and auditors over the four lecture series in Berlin) and the Aesthetics (the combined text that Hotho published) has revealed significant editorial effort on Hotho's part that cannot be correlated with the authority of individual transcripts. And, while Hotho had invaluable sources that later scholars do not, from his own attendance at two of the series and from Hegel's own notebooks (as well as presumably conversation with the master himself), it is clear that there are many passages in the Aesthetics that do not appear in any of the extant student transcripts, as well as many details that are at real variance.

For those who want to assess the development of Hegel's thought about issues in the philosophy of art, Gethmann-Siefert's account of the lectures gives us an aesthetics that is very much a work in progress, rather than the more finished product that Hotho's compilation suggests. The differences in the various iterations of the series are sufficiently striking that Gethmann-Siefert goes so far as to claim that "we may no longer speak of 'the aesthetics' of Hegel" (p. 67) at all -- although it is noteworthy that she immediately adds that the "most important systematic aspects" of his views are identical across the series, as are the "basic concepts of art and, above all, the basic characterization of art."

Among the consequences of a more careful look at the lectures is that a number of the most famous and distinctive elements of the Aesthetics in Hotho's and Knox's volumes -- the general triadic organization of the work as a whole (with its "universal" discussion of beauty; the "particular" forms of symbolic, classical and romantic art; and the "individual" artworks themselves), and the memorable definition of beauty as "the sensuous appearing of the idea," for example -- are in fact elements that Hegel either thought about differently over the course of the various lectures or may not have articulated in the form that Hotho's edition has made so memorable.

But beyond details of organization and formulation, there are several important conceptual issues that emerge over the course of the discussion concerning the best way to view Hegel's overall approach to philosophical questions of art. One issue that is framed especially clearly in Gethmann-Siefert's work is whether one should take Hegel to be engaged in comparing works of art according to some putative general standards of aesthetic judgment, or rather, as she suggests, in broader terms of their historical and cultural significance. This distinction is important to whether one views Hegel's great praise for the ultimate beauty found in Greek art -- as in sculptural renderings such as the "Munich Faun" -- as part of a "classicizing" tendency on his part or rather in terms of a more basic understanding of the historical and cultural purpose of art in a culture where, as Hegel emphasizes, the philosophically curious fact is that it was precisely the artists (Homer, Hesiod, Praxiteles) who were primarily responsible for the revelation of the gods.

A further issue, familiar to most aestheticians who encounter Hegel, concerns his notion of the "end of art" -- or, more precisely stated, as Gethmann-Siefert quotes one of the transcripts of the final lecture series: "Art as explication of truth passes over into something higher, and this factor determines the position of art as it exists for our time, since we are above and beyond art. . . . Art had had its day" (p. 155). The Hegel that emerges from the lectures in this case is important to attend to, since the claim is not (as many of Hegel's critics have erroneously said) that art ceases to be produced but rather that the status and significance of art for us becomes something different in the modern age. Hegel's appeals in the lectures to contemporary works that show what art in the age "beyond art" might offer are instructive -- for example, as Benjamin Rutter and others have recently discussed, his surprising praise of Goethe's Divan of West and East might be not just the result of a peculiar aesthetic preference (then as well as now) but rather of a concern with a modern art form that might offer possibilities expressive of a freedom that runs counter to the subjective and inwardizing tendencies of much in romanticism.

Gethmann-Siefert's judgment in her introduction is one that professes bemusement that Hotho has had such a hold on scholars of Hegel for so long:

as regards the reception of the Aesthetics, we have a curious picture in which people adhere to the authenticity of the original published text, preferring the 'completed shape' of Hegel's philosophy of art over a more accurate insight into the relationships of the subject matter. (p. 33)

But it's not clear that this appeal is simply a matter of habit or fealty to an existing edition or translation. The transcripts themselves are at times attenuated in ways that make Hotho's edition an important interpretive resource for Hegel scholars, as this volume can illustrate, despite the superiority of the 1823 transcript to those of other series. And, as Gethmann-Siefert acknowledges (p. 24, fn 24), whatever scholarly work on the transcripts might show to be due to Hotho's editorial efforts, it might still be the case that Hegel himself would have concurred with many of them, and Hegelian scholars have given perceptive philosophical readings of passages that, as far as we know, appear only in Hotho. If Hotho himself put together a larger "synoptic" table or account of the series (something Gethmann-Siefert rightly laments that he did not leave behind), it's not impossible that his task of harmonizing the different versions was undertaken with some sense of Hegel's own account of his development over the course of the decade.

Who, in the end, is the "de-Hotho-ized" Hegel? On Gethmann-Siefert's view, he is above all a Hegel whose judgments are not imperiously driven in a "top-down" fashion by systematic demands but is rather a phenomenologically perceptive aesthetician who is open to significant change in his assessments of art and over the years increasingly concerned with the question of what can be said to remain distinctively the purpose of art in a modern age where art is not the primary point of access to the most important truths. It must, however, be said that, at least on some key points in Gethmann-Siefert's account, this Hegel is not always so different from the Hegel familiar for so long to readers of Hotho and Knox. She criticizes Hotho, for example, for not making a sufficient connection between epic poetry as an expression of a nation in its great deeds (p.114) and for not giving Dutch painting its due (p.136), yet despite acknowledged differences in subtlety of expression, both are elements that are recognizably present in Hotho and Knox.

In terms of tracing Hegel's development, it should of course also be noted that there are larger perspectives on Hegel's views on aesthetics that cannot be gotten from just the lecture transcripts, important as they are. Some of these issues of Hegel's wider engagement with aesthetics appear in a discussion with the heading "textual fragments and fragmentary thoughts for the aesthetics" in Gethmann-Siefert's introduction, but this turns out to be a somewhat inaccurate framework for handling some of these pre-Berlin sources, since among the "fragments" included is the Phenomenology of Spirit, a difficult but non-fragmentary text that Hegel wrote and published himself. (It is true that the treatment of art there is bound up with the notion of religion, just as it is in the first edition (1817) of the Encyclopedia Hegel published at Heidelberg, but in both cases there is an aesthetic theory which already has crucial elements -- such as the differentiation of symbolic, classical and romantic art forms -- of the later Berlin lectures.)

Oxford's decision to publish translations of editions of the transcripts is one for which English-language scholarship on Hegel can be grateful, and Robert F. Brown's long-term familiarity with translating Hegel's texts is helpful here. Not all of the scholarly apparatus in the German edition is reproduced, and Hotho's outline appears at the end of the translation rather than being inset page-by-page as it appears in the German edition. Sensible decisions have been made about not following 19th century German conventions of long sentences and endless paragraphing (which, in this case, may well reflect Hotho's and not Hegel's own punctuation). The goal announced by the translator appears to have been largely achieved:

to present the contents of Hotho's transcript as best we can in understandable and colloquial English, so that the reader can have at hand one version of Hegel's actual delivery of the lectures on the philosophy of art, as well as have a specific foothold for understanding and evaluating Gethmann-Siefert's contentions about the wider issues surrounding the reception and status of the Aesthetics volumes in the past and today (p. 3).

The decision to publish a translation of the 1998 essay of Gethmann-Siefert's that introduces the Hotho text in the German edition -- Brown says that it should be regarded as sharing "equal billing" as the first part of the two-part volume -- has the consequence of putting into relief the time that has passed since that initial publication. The reader is occasionally jolted awake by what has changed over those years for Hegel studies: Gethmann-Siefert says in the early pages, for example, that "as a rule the aesthetics counts as the only part of Hegel's philosophy still of real importance today" (p. 10) -- a claim that, of course, had a number of challengers in 1998 but presumably has even more in 2015, given the explosion of interest in Hegel in German and in Anglophone philosophy in the intervening years.

At the same time, the republication of the 1998 essay emphasizes how much has still not changed in scholarship on Hegel's aesthetics. Transcriptions of the final lecture series (1828-9) have still not appeared in a German edition, so an ultimate assessment of the trajectory of Hegel's thoughts on aesthetics over the four Berlin lecture series is one that still cannot be fully made by the wider scholarly community -- an important concern, especially since Hotho expressed a fairly critical view of these last lectures, while for Gethmann-Siefert they mark important late changes within the development of Hegel's philosophy of art. This translation of the German transcript of 1823, however, is a very welcome step forward, even as intensive contemporary work on Hegel's logic, philosophy of mind, and social and political philosophy offer possible new occasions for the contemporary reinterpretation of his aesthetics.