Lee, Epistemology After Protagoras: Responses to Relativism in Plato, Aristotle, and Democritus

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Mi-Kyoung Lee, Epistemology After Protagoras: Responses to Relativism in Plato, Aristotle, and Democritus, Oxford University Press, 2005, 304pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199262225.

Reviewed by C.C.W. Taylor, Corpus Christi College, Oxford


Professor Lee's theme is the challenge to objective knowledge posed by Protagoras' relativistic thesis that 'Man is the measure of all things', and the responses to that challenge by Plato, Aristotle, and Democritus. While acknowledging the differences between Protagorean relativism and Hellenistic skepticism, she sees Protagoras and responses to him as foreshadowing some of the later debates between skeptics and dogmatists. Both Protagoras and the skeptics appeal to conflicting appearances and the lack of any criterion to determine which appearances are veridical, but draw different conclusions from these data; the skeptics conclude that is impossible to determine the real nature of things, while Protagoras maintains that the real nature of things is simply that, for each perceiver, the way things appear to that perceiver is the way they are for him/her. Protagoras is thus in skeptical terms a dogmatist, but his peculiar form of dogmatism makes him an ally of the skeptics against those, including Plato, Aristotle, and Democritus, who maintain that underlying the conflicting appearances there is an objective reality accessible to rational theory, assisted in one way or another by observation, and that theory-grounded access to that reality amounts to knowledge.

The core of this book consists of careful exposition and judicious appraisal of the arguments by which those three philosophers seek to refute the assumptions which they take to underpin Protagorean relativism and thereby to justify their own commitment to objectivity. Since understanding of those responses in turn presupposes understanding of what they were responses to, she begins with Protagoras himself, first discussing the ancient evidence for the content of his work entitled Truth (which opened with the famous 'Man the Measure' slogan), and then seeking a precise characterization of Protagoras' theory in terms of distinctions developed by modern critics including Burnyeat and Fine. Here a central issue is whether Protagoras held a relativist theory of truth or whether he was rather an 'infallibilist' (the term is Fine's), i.e. whether he maintained that all beliefs are true simpliciter. On this thorny issue Lee's conclusion is finely nuanced. Protagoras' position (as set out by Plato in the Theaetetus) 'contains elements of both relativism about truth and infallibilism' (p. 31); on the one hand Protagoras is represented as 'proposing an infallibilist epistemology, not a theory of relative truth: Protagoras' is the thesis that everyone is always correct concerning what is true'. On the other hand 'on the theory he [Plato] develops for Protagoras to support this thesis, all properties are to be relativized, including truth' (ibid.). This seems to me broadly correct. In the dialogue Protagoras initially espouses what we may call 'predicate-relativism' (or 'relativism of fact' (p. 45)), i.e. the theory that to be F is to be F-for-someone. Initially restricted to a range of perceptual predicates such as 'hot' and 'sweet', that theory allows him to maintain that each individual's judgement of what is F (i.e., F-for-the perceiver) is unrestrictedly true. But as Plato develops the position the extension of F is widened to include all predicates, including 'true'; hence truth-relativism is introduced as a special case of predicate-relativism.

This initial discussion of Protagoras' relativism has already introduced Plato's treatment of it, since, as Lee points out, there is little or no evidence of the content of that thesis which is independent of the discussion in the Theaetetus. The next two chapters are devoted to detailed exposition and criticism of that discussion. Chapter 4 deals with the arguments which aim to refute Protagoras, with special emphasis on the 'self-refutation' argument of 171a-c, where Socrates argues that since Protagoras acknowledges that most people think that his relativistic thesis is false, he is committed by the thesis itself to holding that their belief that the thesis is false is true, and hence that the thesis itself is false. A standard criticism of this argument is that it fails because it relies on omission of the crucial relativising phrases 'true for Protagoras' opponents' and 'true for Protagoras'; Protagoras must admit that it is true for him that his thesis is false for his opponents, but he can admit that without inconsistency. He would refute himself if he had to admit that his thesis is both true for him and false for him, but this argument cannot yield that conclusion. Lee defends Plato against this criticism, pointing out that at 167d Protagoras is represented as putting forward the relativistic thesis as itself an objective truth; everyone is a measure of the truth of their beliefs, whether or not they believe that they are. And that second-order thesis, that the thesis is true for everyone, is unqualifiedly inconsistent with Protagoras' admission that it is not true for those who believe that it is not true. Lee acknowledges (p. 56) that there are various moves which would allow Protagoras to escape from this trap, including making his own theory a meta-truth which does not fall within its own scope, but argues convincingly that these would depart from the way Protagoras is represented in the dialogue. The resulting refutation is indeed ad hominem, but that is not a weakness in Plato's strategy, which highlights a defect, not merely in the position adopted by Protagoras, but in any form of relativism. For relativists, even if not strictly speaking inconsistent, are driven to make objective claims which it is the professed purpose of their own theory to undermine. Chapter 5 is an impressively thorough examination of the 'Secret Doctrine', in which Plato gives a metaphysical account of a world in which property-relativism holds. She argues, against the influential view of McDowell, Burnyeat and others, that Plato does not represent this as implied by Protagoras' relativistic thesis, but as giving the best explanation of how that theory might be true. While that is a large issue on which debate will no doubt continue, she certainly makes a good case for her dissenting view.

The next two chapters examine Aristotle's treatment of Protagoras in Metaphysics Γ. Aristotle's aim is to identify and refute beliefs leading to denial of the principle of non-contradiction, among which he cites Protagoras' thesis that all appearances are true. This and similar doctrines he attributes to the fundamental error of thinking that only what can be perceived is real, which embraces the epistemological thesis that there is no more to knowing than perceiving and the metaphysical thesis that 'the whole of reality is constituted by material, perceptible, and changeable nature' (p. 119). A significant theme in this section is the continuity between Aristotle's discussion and that of the Theaetetus; thus Aristotle's developed distinction between thinking and perceiving builds on the refutation at Tht. 184-7 of the definition of knowledge as perception, which assumes a model of perception and thought as passive affections of the senses (pp. 152-8). At the same time, dissection of these fundamental errors amounts to a response to the skeptical challenge to knowledge, since Aristotle thinks that the same errors which lead to denial of the principle of non-contradiction lead to the conclusion that knowledge is impossible. Hence as well as continuity with Plato we see continuity with the later debates between skeptics and dogmatists.

In the last two chapters Democritus enters the debate. Precisely where to place him is a tricky question, since on the one hand he is reported as arguing that Protagoras' relativism is self-refuting, while on the other we have evidence for the Protagorean-sounding view that we can know nothing beyond appearances, to which he adds the twist that criticism of the senses as unreliable is also self-refuting. Lee handles this material with exemplary clarity and judgement. After a concise and helpful account of the sources, she concentrates on Democritus' epistemology and its basis in his psychology, with detailed discussion of the evidence from Aristotle, Theophrastus' On the Senses and the epistemological fragments preserved by Sextus. Her conclusion (which is fairly close to my own position in The Atomists: Leucippus and Democritus (Toronto, 1999), a work which she generously acknowledges) is that while Democritus agrees with Protagoras that the senses are infallible about appearances, he disagrees in so far as he distinguishes knowledge of appearances from knowledge of reality, which is achieved not by registering appearances, but by theoretical reasoning grounded in experience. The famous complaint of the senses that theory refutes itself by attacking experience (DK68B125) is, she suggests, not a definitive statement of self-refutation but a move in a dialectical debate between the senses and the mind, whose final resolution is that 'both must be accepted as 'canons' or means of acquiring knowledge. The senses are a source of knowledge whose reports the mind relies on to make its own discoveries and formulate its own aitiologiai [explanations]' (p. 247). I can do no more than record my agreement.

Throughout Lee shows admirable command of the wide range of ancient texts which she discusses, and she has made a valuable contribution by stressing thematic continuities between the 'classical period' (5th-4th centuries BC) and later epistemological debates and by locating Democritus in the context of debates initiated by Plato and Aristotle. She also demonstrates thorough knowledge of the extensive secondary literature. This is a highly commendable first book, which makes one look forward to the author's next production.