Legal Ethics and Human Dignity

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David Luban, Legal Ethics and Human Dignity, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 337pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521862851.

Reviewed by Charles Silver, University of Texas at Austin


This book collects essays and lectures produced over roughly the preceding two decades. It will likely have the most value for new readers who would gain by having a large selection of David Luban's writings in one place and for specialists in jurisprudence or the professional responsibilities of lawyers. The chapters air Luban's mostly familiar views on lawyers' role morality, the duty to keep secrets, the right against self-incrimination, the morality of pro bono legal services, Lon Fuller's virtue ethics, the role of lawyers in educating the public, and the obsession many law professors have with Supreme Court Justices and their opinions. Many subjects have little to do with conventional legal ethics, which may be a virtue or a vice depending on one's disposition. Personally, I would have liked more analyses of concrete problems and less philosophizing.

I found the book's layout frustrating. Instead of launching directly into a positive account of lawyers' responsibilities, Chapter 1 offers 40+ pages refuting what Luban calls the adversary system excuse (ASE), according to which lawyers' institutional role as advocates insulates them from moral responsibility for the larger effects of actions taken on behalf of clients. A person not previously persuaded of ASE will find this material slow going and wonder why it holds so prominent a place.

The positive thesis comes in Chapter 2, where Luban contends that "what makes the practice of law worthwhile is upholding human dignity" (p. 66). For Luban, human dignity is affirmed when people have lawyers who help tell their stories. Following Alan Donagan, he argues that one respects a person's dignity by treating his testimony on a serious matter as being in good faith, no matter how untrustworthy he may be (p. 68).

Luban's first practical application of this view reveals some of its weaknesses and defects. He discusses a criminal case in which a defendant is tried for possessing stolen property, a TV set found in the rear seat of his car. According to Luban, the culprit's defense lawyer would be morally right to argue to the jury that the defendant's decision to place the TV in plain view instead of hiding it in the trunk supports his claim that he did not know the TV was stolen. The real explanation for the TV being in the rear seat, the lawyer knows, is that the trunk was locked and the defendant had no key. The jurors are ignorant of this because the defendant "took the Fifth."

One problem with this example is that the lawyer's story is not the defendant's "testimony" (Donagan's word), the defendant having remained silent. Lawyers distinguish categories of evidence, only one of which is testimony. Because testimony is a person's sworn statement, the desire to uphold human dignity may have implications concerning lawyers' use of testimony that do not apply to lawyers' use of evidence of other kinds. In the example, of course, the lawyer's argument rests on a lack of evidence, creating the possibility that the link to dignity is even weaker.

For Luban, the difficulty just described seems not to matter. He thinks a lawyer's job is to tell a client's story and, when the client is a defendant in a criminal matter, lapsing into fiction is fine. This raises a second problem: in the example, the story told by the lawyer is not the defendant's story at all. The defendant could not swear to the truth of the lawyer's explanation of the presence of the TV in the rear seat. He could not even swear to his own innocence. The story is simply a lawyer's point that may persuade a jury to find reasonable doubt, as Luban sees (p. 73). How, then, does the lawyer uphold the defendant's dignity by telling it?

For Luban, the requirement of proving criminal guilt beyond reasonable doubt provides the answer. "[T]his standard says that if a good-faith story of innocence could be constructed from the evidence, it violates the human dignity of the defendant to convict -- even if that story is untrue" (p. 73). I find this unpersuasive. First, how is a defendant's dignity upheld when a lawyer convinces a group of jurors to believe something about him that is false? Second, the standard of proof is the same in misdemeanor criminal cases, but some states allow non-unanimous guilty verdicts in these cases, implying that human dignity can survive conviction even when a plausible story of innocence not contradicted by the evidence can be told. Third, the argument selects among possible justifications for the proof standard without showing that the desire to protect human dignity argument provides the best explanation. Finally, what of the jurors' dignity? In Luban's example, one can easily imagine the jurors feeling like dupes if they learned the truth after finding the defendant not guilty.

Luban also uses the dignity argument to justify the Fifth Amendment, which prohibits a government from compelling a criminal defendant "to be a witness against himself." Luban defends the prohibition, arguing that forced self-incrimination humiliates a defendant by involving him in the process of punishing himself (p. 83). This would seem to be an empirical matter that may vary across defendants. Some defendants may experience the law's demand for their testimony as a sign of respect -- only competent persons can testify; as a symbol of their importance -- "the jurors need to hear from you"; or as part of a self-affirming experience of explaining what happened and taking responsibility. Some defendants forced to testify against themselves may even see the experience as an important step in their moral development. The character of Raskolnikov in Crime and Punishment comes to mind.

Luban's views on the importance of lawyers also puzzle me. He twice asserts that a large cadre of uniformly trained attorneys is "an indispensable material condition" or "a necessary precondition" for the rule of law (pp. 3 & 140). This would seem to imply that law schools with standardized curricula predated the rule of law in the U.S. or, at least, strengthened the rule of law when they appeared. Yet, the rule of law obviously took hold in the U.S. long before law schools' curricula were standardized, and a large population of lawyers has not prevented the U.S. from putting more people behind bars than any other country. Insofar as property crime is concerned, the rule of law has been replaced to a significant degree by the rule of deadbolts, firearms, home security systems, LoJacks, private police, and insurance companies. Most people obey the criminal law voluntarily, for a mix of reasons, but I doubt America's lawyers can take much credit for that.

Luban also exaggerates the extent to which people learn about law from lawyers. For him, "[t]he lawyer-client consultation is the primary point of intersection between 'The Law' and the people it governs, the point at which the law on the books becomes the law in action" (p. 131). This seems flat wrong to me. Many people live their entire lives without consulting lawyers, but everyone uses law and experiences its consequences every day. Apply for a credit card and incur an obligation to pay. Pay rent and have a right to a roof over one's head. Make a gift and lose all rights in the property. Take a job and have a right to payment. Buy a lawn mower and acquire the right to have your neighbor ask before borrowing it. Have a child and become responsible for it. Get in a car wreck and file an insurance claim. Write a check and watch your bank debit your account. As the current economic downturn puts millions of homeowners with subprime mortgages at risk of foreclosure, many people are learning more about law than they ever hoped to know. The law in action intersects with ordinary people billions of times a day without any help from attorneys -- which is good, because lawyers are expensive.

Chapter 5, which criticizes the lawyers who drafted memos defending the Bush Administration's use of torture, is the best part of the book. Not coincidentally, it is also the least abstract. By using treaties, statutes, and secondary authorities to dissect the lawyers' arguments, Luban shows they did shoddy work. (Unfortunately, I do not know this area of law and have not dug into the primary sources. I assume Luban presented them accurately and fairly.) The explanation is more nefarious than a mere lack of talent. Everyone knew torture was illegal, but highly placed government officials wanted the freedom to torture suspected terrorists, so lawyers in the Justice Department's Office of Legal Counsel gave them cover.

Chapter 5 is, however, also naïve. The closer one gets to the top of a governmental hierarchy, the less power law has to constrain political actions. The U.S. Supreme Court is a court of law, but law constrains the Court only when the Court wants it to. No one can reverse the Court when it gets the law wrong or exceeds its lawful powers. You may rightly think the Court got the law wrong hundreds of times, but the Court has the final say on what the law is, and it disagrees. You may rightly think the Court lacked jurisdiction to decide a particular matter, but the Court wanted to decide it, so it did. Even surrounded by law, "it's great to be king."

Perhaps recognizing this, Luban puts the burden of constraining political acts on government lawyers, who, he contends, are ethically bound to provide candid and independent advice when writing legal memos (p. 198). His authority is Rule 2.1 of the Model Rules of Professional Conduct, adopted by the American Bar Association. This merits a guffaw. Can Luban seriously contend that lawyers working on matters of the utmost importance for persons holding the highest positions in the Executive Branch must adhere to standards set by the ABA, a private association? I doubt he believes this. Rather, he cited the ABA rule because he thinks candor and independence are essential traits of the professional lawyer. I might agree, but what response can be given to the skeptic who says, "The client is the President of the United States (or the Vice President, etc.) and he doesn't want a professional lawyer. He wants a memo to wave around."

The matter is obviously more complicated than this. By ignoring contrary authority, the lawyers who composed the memos may have violated Justice Department guidelines. They may have violated oaths they swore to uphold the Constitution. But in the end, laws, regulations, and professional norms have limited power to constrain highly placed officials who are bent on circumventing them. Public outrage, political pressure, and Congressional investigations are likely to be more effective.

Moral enlightenment and the courage to act on one's convictions can constrain governmental abuses too. When President Nixon ordered the firing of Special Prosecutor Cox, Attorney General Richardson and Deputy Attorney General Ruckelshaus did not comply; they resigned. They were not forced to resign by virtue of being lawyers; Solicitor General Bork carried out Nixon's order, and he was a lawyer too. They resigned because they thought Nixon was wrong on a matter of great importance to the country. Their resignations also increased the pressure on Nixon to step down, a resignation being a powerful moral statement. The torture lawyers could have resigned too. Presumably, they did what they were asked to do because they supported the use of torture. That is the real tragedy, not their failure to adhere to someone's conception of the true attorney.

I close this review by noting that Luban criticizes my view on the morality of pro bono legal work at the end of Chapter 2. I believe that lawyers should be charitable, but I see no reason to encourage lawyers' charity to take the form of legal services rather than cash donations or help of other kinds. Luban thinks monetary assistance is humiliating. To show this, he locates me at the reception desk of a legal aid office and has me offer prospective clients with pressing legal needs a choice between money and representation. Luban thus conjures up an insulting way of offering financial assistance and accuses me of degrading the poor. A more charitable scholar would have asked whether poor persons, including but not limited to those with identified legal needs, could be offered money or lawyer-funded services in less degrading ways. Perhaps they could apply for all-purpose grants or loans that lawyers would fund. Perhaps they could receive support payments funded by sales taxes on legal services. Perhaps lawyers would donate money to umbrella organizations that would in turn fund community centers, medical facilities, housing renovations, or family law clinics in poor neighborhoods. To my way of thinking, a preference for pro bono legal services over other forms of charity will appeal only to persons preoccupied with law.