Legal Philosophy in the Twentieth Century: The Common Law World

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Gerald J. Postema, Legal Philosophy in the Twentieth Century: The Common Law World, Springer, 2011, 618pp., $349.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789048189595.

Reviewed by Michael Sevel, University of Sydney


The philosophy of law is a curious line of work, partly due to the diversity among one's co-workers, and the related ongoing challenge of their engaging in mutually profitable discussion. Among one's colleagues are practicing lawyers and judges, who sometimes use words like "Socratic", "metaphysical", and "theoretical" in a pejorative spirit, as rhetorical devices and nothing more. There are of course also traditionally trained and skilled philosophers, who, despite their best efforts, sometimes intellectualize (or moralize) what law is like, and what lawyers and judges do, to the point of caricature. These philosophers draw on what amounts to an average citizen's understanding of legal practice and process, and often consult common experience, popular culture, and a severely limited set of examples, as their pre-theoretical data. And there are still others: the occasional literary scholar, political theorist, and even politician. I point out this unusual diversity because I think it has directly contributed to an unfortunate effect throughout legal philosophy over the last several decades: a widespread lack of knowledge of its history. Between lawyers' instinctive preference for the present, and Anglophone analytic philosophers' long-standing ambivalence towards their own history, many in legal-philosophical circles are only vaguely aware of the traditions of thought in which they work.

One need only look to the most influential works in the field over the last fifty years to see the striking absence of nearly any acknowledgement of the long history of philosophical theorizing about law. H.L.A. Hart, in his seminal The Concept of Law (1961), discusses primarily the views of the nineteenth century English theorist John Austin. There are a few scattered mentions of Austin and Jeremy Bentham in Joseph Raz's influential collection of essays, The Authority of Law (1st ed. 1979), but otherwise engagement only with the views of his contemporaries. And Ronald Dworkin, in his 470-page Law's Empire (1986), merely mentions Hart and Austin (twice), notoriously discussing no one's views but his own. It is no wonder that generations of scholars who work in the shadows of these theorists have developed something of a tin ear to history.

Enter Gerald Postema, who has done as much as anyone to remedy the problem. His now-classic Bentham and the Common Law Tradition (1986), his many important essays over the last thirty years, and this latest volume, combine to serve as a near seamless history of Anglophone philosophy of law from 1600 to the present. In the current volume, all the virtues of Postema's earlier writings are on display: clarity of exposition, philosophical rigor and curiosity, charitable but critical engagement with sometimes difficult texts, and provision of helpful historical context of the theories discussed. Aside from the few quibbles I discuss below, the volume is a magisterial achievement, and should serve as a valuable resource for specialists and non-specialists alike for years to come.

Two points should be kept in mind regarding Postema's precise subject matter. First, by 'legal philosophy', he means the set of questions often identified as 'general jurisprudence' (xxii), a search for the general and universal characteristics of law, which are had by all legal systems, both actual and possible -- as Hobbes once put it, to explain "not what is law here, and there, but what is law." The volume therefore omits discussion of a range of more specific philosophical questions related to law, e.g., the justification of punishment and the nature of rights, as well as the philosophical foundations of specific domains of law, for example the criminal or tort law. Second, this is a history of the development of legal philosophy, so defined, in the "common law world", that is, within countries whose legal systems are at least partly constituted by a body of legal principles (the 'common law'), used and developed by judges on a case-by-case basis, principles which are binding on later courts as 'precedent' to be used in deciding future cases. The volume therefore focuses on developments primarily in England and the United States, though interspersed are contributions by theorists from Australia, Canada, New Zealand, and Scotland.

In Chapter 1, "Analytic Jurisprudence Established", Postema sets the stage for the rest of the book by giving a sense of the state of jurisprudence, particularly in England, around the turn of the twentieth century. John Austin's theory of law as set out in his The Province of Jurisprudence Determined (1832), roughly that law is the command of a sovereign backed by the threat of sanction of its citizens upon noncompliance, was the reigning orthodoxy across the common law world for over a century. The theory was subjected to criticism by a wide variety of theorists -- from American philosopher John Dewey (in an 1894 essay) to A.V. Dicey, the imminent English constitutional law scholar -- but most objections did not strike at its basic assumptions. However, Dicey, and later John Salmond in the 1890s, came closest to overturning the orthodoxy by arguing against Austin's general account of legal validity as a matter of sovereign command, in favor of the view that the practice of recognition (i.e., application) of a rule by courts is the ultimate test of legal validity.

But the force of these criticisms, and the alternative court-centric view of law, would not be fully appreciated until the 1960s. The reason was that during the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, jurisprudence (conceived as anything resembling a philosophical enterprise) was decidedly out of fashion. The field was "narrowly analytical, increasingly resistant to reform, and dismissive of systematic philosophical reflection" (26). Philosophy of law was seen as "vague and viewy" (30). It was regarded as primarily of pedagogical value, in providing a conceptual framework for the study of law. A striking outlier in this period was Michael Oakeshott; in a prescient and still-neglected 1938 essay ("The Concept of a Philosophical Jurisprudence"), he argued for a conception of the philosophy of law that would not come into its own until decades later, as a historically informed inquiry into "the rational explanation of the nature of law" (36-39). But, alas, this suggestion was against the spirit of the times. The field languished in Austinian dogma, and was ripe for change.

Postema tells the story of legal philosophy in the twentieth century as "a tale of two Boston lectures", coincidentally both published, sixty years apart, in the Harvard Law Review, and each of which suggested trajectories of thought that gave shape and inspiration to debates for the rest of the century. The first was a lecture given by Oliver Wendell Holmes, the future United States Supreme Court Justice, to a group of law students at Boston University in 1897, later published as "The Path of the Law." The second lecture -- coincidentally a memorial lecture named for Holmes -- was given by the Oxford philosopher H.L.A. Hart at Harvard Law School in 1957, later published as "Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals." Postema organizes most of the book by discussion of the legacies of these two lectures, first that of Holmes (Chapters 2-6) and then of Hart (Chapters 7-12). He presents these legacies separately and for good reason: the research programs spawned by them ran almost completely parallel to each other until nearly the end of the twentieth century. They also took on very different characters in substance. Theorists following Holmes shared "no common agenda and no agreement on method or approach" (xxiii); by contrast, those following Hart have been "relatively well-behaved" (xxiii) and have worked through a more or less common philosophical agenda in a dialectically coherent way over the last half-century.

First, the Holmesian legacy. Holmes himself was no philosopher, and held "savagely skeptical" (46) views of morality, a hyper-Hobbesian outlook more often these days articulated by undergraduates in introductory ethics courses: that moral claims reduce without remainder to mere power relations between ruthlessly self-interested individuals. Postema notes that Holmes was friendly with his philosophy colleagues in Boston, but speculates that he was likely intimidated by them (e.g., Williams James, but especially C.S. Pierce) (47 n7)). His "The Path of the Law" reads as a somewhat meandering but provocative discussion of the common law, intended as a collection of advice to law students embarking on a career in legal practice. One of Holmes's targets in the essay was a theory of adjudication (that is, a theory of both how judges decide, and ought to decide, cases) often called 'formalism'. In its strongest form, formalism is roughly the view that judges decide, and ought to decide, cases by appeal only to the valid law of their jurisdiction, and that they justify their decisions in those cases by constructing something akin to an Aristotelian syllogism, whereby the relevant legal proposition is the major premise, the complex statement of the facts of a case the minor premise. The outcome in each case (e.g., "Plaintiff is liable to defendant for negligently causing her injury") is supposed to follow deductively from the relevant legal sources as applied to the facts. Postema convincingly shows (48-57) that it is likely no one ever held this view, but that 'formalism' nonetheless "served . . . as a convenient term of abuse" throughout the twentieth century (49), in part owing to Holmes's early caricature. Against such 'mechanical jurisprudence', Holmes suggested that lawyers take up the point of view of a 'bad man' and ask only what the likelihood of sanction will be in a particular case before the courts, and to regard that, for practical purposes, as the law of the land. "The prophecies of what the courts will do in fact, and nothing more pretentious, are what I mean by the law." This is the Helen that launched a thousand jurisprudential ships in American legal philosophy, and yet Postema reminds us that this idea "was in the air and not all that radical" (54) and was in fact anticipated twenty years earlier by English jurist and friend of Holmes, Frederick Pollock. To the extent there was an actual theory of law amidst the high rhetoric of Holmes's writings, Postema shows that it was an amalgam of standard ideas from Common Law theory and Austinian positivism (77).

The first ship to launch was an early and influential twentieth century movement in the United States called Legal Realism, carried out by a loose confederation of primarily law professors and theoretically minded lawyers and judges. Formalism consistently served as the foil in development of these various views. Most realists held that contrary to the claims of formalism, a look at the actual practice of judges revealed that legal sources are both causally and rationally indeterminate, and so were insufficient to fully explain the outcomes of cases. Judges respond "to the stimulus of the facts in the concrete cases before them" (126) rather than the law. They reason from, rather than to, conclusions; the legal arguments they make in written opinions are mere "window dressing", post hoc rationalizations of conclusions arrived at through intuition (118). Realists' preoccupation with "how judges think" (119) yielded a variety of claims about what really explains judicial decisions, many of which implicitly relied on the social sciences. Felix Cohen thought judges channel cultural norms and other 'social forces'; Herman Oliphant wrote of the tutored intuitions of judges, molded by their technical experience of deciding legal cases (129). Karl Llewellyn, the most systematic of the Realists, claimed that a judge's 'situation-sense' was shaped by 'traditions' in legal practice and other 'judicial habits' (136-37). Jerome Frank, an American judge and the most eccentric of these writers, claimed that a judge's unconscious idiosyncrasies were most explanatorily relevant; he urged the writing of psychoanalytic biographies of judges to assist litigants who appear before them to determine the likely outcome of their case. Postema notes that despite their "suggestive creativity", the Realists ultimately did not have the "intellectual stamina and philosophical sophistication" to develop a robust theory of law (138-39).

This first wave of Realism in the United States influenced an eclectic mix of theorists with diverse aims, disciplinary backgrounds, and politics. Harvard legal academic Lon Fuller and economist Friedrich Hayek each developed influential accounts of the ideal of the rule of law, and sketched out theories of law that laid emphasis on its 'implicit' dimension, the "intermeshing of anticipations of rational self-directing agents", which evolve into stable points of expectation between legal officials and citizens (153). Hayek described something like this state of affairs as "spontaneous order", which both the law and the market characteristically exemplify (165). Postema here engages in charitable exposition of sometimes obscure and imprecise texts, and acknowledges that these theories have had limited influence, especially after the rise of Hart's positivism in the 1960s.

In Chapters 5 and 6, Postema discusses, again charitably, the views of a later generation of theorists influenced by the Realists, under the rubrics of the 'law and economics' and 'critical jurisprudence' literatures, but again fails to find any genuine innovations in the philosophical theory of law. With respect to 'economic jurisprudence', Postema devotes most attention to the views of American Judge Richard Posner, by far the most prolific contributor to this literature; but Postema ultimately finds there a crude pragmatism wedded to a pretty standard form of legal realism (cf. "Posner's muddle", 210 n17). Postema's discussion of 'critical jurisprudence', which includes the views of both "Critical Legal Studies" and feminist writers, is more interesting and compelling, though ultimately yields few advances beyond orthodox ideas about the nature of law (258). For example, while the ideas that "law is male" or "law rules in a male way" can be taken as metaphysical theses, in the feminist jurisprudence literature they turn out to be expressions referring to how law has been unjustly used, rather than about what it essentially is. Despite this, Postema's discussion here is valuable in its own right, as it provides one of the most lucid and sympathetic philosophical presentations I have encountered of the feminist critique of the long-standing ideal of objectivity in law, as a means of gender oppression (240-256), developed by Catherine MacKinnon and others since the 1980s.

Postema's treatment of Hart and his legacy is more complex and systematic, owing not only to Hart's more philosophically sophisticated texts, but also to the immense literature that they have spawned over the last half-century. Hart, he says, "taught Anglo-American jurisprudence again to speak the language of philosophy" (262). Postema explains the genealogy of Hart's classic The Concept of Law (1961) as itself a tale of two Austins: the nineteenth century philosopher of law John Austin and the Oxford ordinary language philosopher, and Hart's colleague, J.L. Austin (264). With regard to the former Austin, Hart is often credited as having conclusively refuted Austin's theory of sovereign command in the opening chapters of The Concept of Law, but Postema demonstrates that these same criticisms were first put forth decades earlier by Salmond and others, with the barest of acknowledgement by Hart. The influence of the latter Austin was roughly that Hart sought not a definition of 'law', but to explain the concept that underlies core instances of its use (265).

Hart's great advance over the earlier Austin was to introduce the idea of a (social) rule, to distinguish several kinds of them, and then to argue that law was a complex institutionalized system of such rules. Hart's account of a rule starts with the idea of a pattern of behavior among members of a given community, and distinguishes different perspectives from which to view that pattern. One is the 'external' perspective, which considers only behavioral regularities and not the normative significance of that behavior. Both Holmes and Austin took up this perspective with regard to legal rules and practices; Hart thought they and like-minded theorists were all mistaken because they ignored the normative significance those practices have for the participants of those practices (the 'insiders'). Hart thus suggested legal philosophy must attend to the 'internal' point of view of social rules to adequately understand the nature of law. On his view, law is a system of rules unified by what he called a 'rule of recognition', a social practice in which legal officials (and most especially judges) take up this internal, critical and reflective attitude towards a rule that specifies the criteria of legal validity for all rules of the system (Hart's favored, and simplified, example: "What the Queen-in-Parliament enacts is law").

These are the bare bones of Hart's profoundly influential legal positivism; in Chapter 7, Postema concisely sets out the many interpretations given of Hart's theory in the decades that followed. But the rest of the volume is -- just as the rest of the century was -- concerned with the various ways legal philosophers reacted to Hart's positivism, both critically and constructively. Hart's earliest and most persistent critic, Ronald Dworkin, first objected that Hart's rule of recognition, with its basis purely in social practice, could not explain cases in which judges appeared to cite moral principles as determinative of a particular legal outcome. These cases, he argued, seem to indicate that there can be moral criteria of legal validity, quite apart from social practice (406). This objection spawned a debate among positivists in the 1980s and 90s ("The Incorporation Debate", Chapter 10) as to whether moral criteria could be 'incorporated' into a rule of recognition (e.g., a constitutional prohibition on "cruel and unusual" punishment) by way of a social practice that reflected acceptance of the relevant moral principle, or whether law is such that morality cannot serve as even a part of the criteria of legal validity, for example because it would interfere with the characteristic function of law of issuing authoritative and final pronouncements about what its subjects ought to do.

Dworkin's initial criticisms of Hart formed the basis of his own 'interpretive' theory of law, according to which the law of a community is the set of propositions that follow from the moral principles that explain, and best justify, the relevant institutional history of that community. In developing both this view and the early criticisms, Dworkin would often misconstrue the claims and arguments of Hart and other positivists, which lead to years of confusing and contentious debate among later theorists. However, Postema patiently, and with admirable charity, teases out the most interesting dialectical strands of these exchanges on both sides of the debate.

Joseph Raz's positivism extended and enriched Hart's, and in fact provided a new rationale for thinking moral standards cannot be incorporated into tests for legal validity, which were otherwise based in social sources. Raz claims that necessarily, law claims legitimate (i.e., moral) practical authority, and the business of practical authority is to issue directives that serve as preemptive reasons for action regarding what its putative subjects ought to do; the content of those directives therefore must be identifiable without resort to moral argument. Raz's account of authority and its place in the law is complex and embedded within a broader theory of normativity, and Postema aptly and accurately summarizes much of the voluminous secondary literature responding to various facets of Raz's views on the authority of law, particularly as an argument for positivism.

I am less confident in Postema's speculations regarding the origins and historical context of both Dworkin's and Raz's theories. Dworkin, he says, "did not look for inspiration to major figures in the history of philosophical jurisprudence", but rather the "local jurisprudence of [Justice Benjamin] Cardozo, Fuller, and post-realist American legal theory" as well as Rawls's theory of reflective equilibrium (402). These connections can of course be made in aspects of Dworkin's views, but it is unlikely that the inspiration ended there. The most obvious connection to be made, from a broad historical perspective, is to Common Law theory of the seventeenth century. Those theorists (e.g., Matthew Hale and Edward Coke) also made the general suggestion that law is a set of social practices of a community 'seen in their morally best light.' The stories diverge from there, but Dworkin's 'interpretivism' and Common Law theory are together the only historical examples of views that draw a conceptual connection between the value of a social practice and the content of the law in a given jurisdiction. With respect to Raz, Postema mentions only the "Hobbesian parentage" of Raz's theory of authority (365), in particular the idea of a content-independent reason. That is likely correct as far as it goes, but the historical currents running through Raz's thought are more complex and diverse than this. I've argued elsewhere that there are deep Aristotelian themes as well, and others besides.[1]

Natural law theory makes a brief appearance in the penultimate chapter -- for some, perhaps, all too brief. Legal positivists have always formulated their position as asserting something that natural law theorists denied -- for example that law and morality are 'separate', or at least 'separable' -- so one would have expected an ongoing conversation between these positions throughout the twentieth century. And yet, renewed interest in natural law theory did not come until the early 1980s, with the work of John Finnis, and later Ernest Weinrib and Jeremy Waldron. These writers have all argued for some important and close connection between legal and moral standards, though in very different ways. But Postema's discussion raises the question of where exactly the locus of disagreement is supposed to be between natural lawyers and positivists. Given that there are themes in the positivist theories of Hart and Raz that strongly resemble natural law views (547), and Finnis's theory of law in the end strongly resembles a form of positivism (558), one begins to wonder what all the fuss has been about.

One interesting recurring theme in Postema's history is that at each major dialectical transition in the twentieth century, one finds interaction between legal philosophy and legal education. Austin, Salmond, Holmes, the Realists and their progeny, and Hart all wrote either directly to law students, or else to the legal academy, and many of them sought to provide theoretical support for proposals as to how the law should be taught to future lawyers in law schools. This diverse group of theorists shared the view that how people should learn the law in a given jurisdiction -- that is, how the content of a legal system should be organized and presented to novices -- depends in some important way on what law is in general.[2] The recurrence of this assumption is striking, and should assuage any worry that legal philosophy necessarily has no non-neutral implications for its target discourse.[3]

Another lesson of Postema's history is that the field of legal philosophy itself has undergone disciplinary and sociological changes since the turn of the twentieth century, ones that will no doubt affect its form, content, and prospects into the future. For roughly the first half of the twentieth century, the field was dominated by legal educators and professionals. Lawyers and judges with little or no philosophical training made provocative and sometimes bizarre claims about law that, while often imprecise and obscure, nonetheless brought about innovation, suggesting new lines of research in legal philosophy and sometimes other cognate disciplines. Since Hart's pioneering work in the 1950s and -60s came to prominence, however, the field has been, for better or worse, firmly in the hands of academic philosophers, and lawyers with at least some training in philosophy. The result has been a more dialectically palatable literature, and one that increasingly references and coheres with other adjacent literatures within philosophy, for example within metaphysics, action theory, and metaethics. One repeated criticism of this recent trend is that innovation has slowed considerably as a result, and even that the field has become uninteresting, stagnant, and isolated from the practice of law as well as the study of law in other disciplines, particularly the social sciences.

A final salient feature of the history that Postema sets out is the persistent fixation by legal philosophers throughout the twentieth century on the data of legal practice, narrowly construed -- primarily the activities of judges and practicing lawyers. Many of the leading objections over the last half century, for example, to legal positivism or the general approach of explaining law as a special kind of social convention (or set of social conventions) are variations on the theme: but that's not what lawyers and judges do. Law, it has been said, is an "argumentative practice" (537), and any theory that fails to take account of that is wanting. But it's worth meditating on the priority given to "legal practice" and its argumentative character among the diverse set of pre-theoretical data. If one hangs around the courthouse too long, one may get the idea that 'legal practice' is all there is to explain. But no one lives at the courthouse. Law governs its subjects more or less directly, for example, mediating nearly every interpersonal relationship and all manner of private commercial activity (from marriage to poker games to stock trading), both within and across countries. We do not need lawyers for law to do that. Indeed, in the long view of history, lawyers as they are thought of today are a relatively new invention, and philosophical theorizing about law has been profitably going on for much longer. The preference in recent legal philosophy is to ignore this datum, though that preference has gone undefended by everyone.

Postema's book is long. Fortunately, the chapters are helpfully written as mostly self-standing expositions of a manageable number of theorists and arguments; the result is that the chapters and subsections are useful essays in their own right, for both research and pedagogical purposes. Here I have touched on only the broadest themes in them; there are many other interesting twists and turns in Postema's history that merit sustained attention.

[1] See Michael Sevel, "The Constitution of Authority," Jurisprudence (2014) 5(2): 430-441.

[2] And the view persists: see John Gardner, "Law and Philosophy," in Simon Halliday ed., An Introduction to the Study of Law (Edinburgh: W. Green, 2012).

[3] David Enoch asserts this in an unpublished manuscript, "Is General Jurisprudence Interesting?".