Legislating Morality: Pluralism and Religious Identity in Lawmaking

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Peach, Lucinda, Legislating Morality: Pluralism and Religious Identity in Lawmaking, Oxford University Press, 2002, 218pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-514371-X.

Reviewed by Matt Bagger, Columbia University


In Legislating Morality: Pluralism and Religious Identity in Lawmaking, Lucinda Peach addresses the lively recent debate about the extent to which religious convictions should influence legislation in the United States. She terms the issue a dilemma because either to condone or prohibit religious influence on lawmaking risks the infringement of constitutional rights. To condone religious influence on lawmaking risks the violation of the First-Amendment religion clauses, which guarantee the free exercise of religion to all, and proscribe the establishment of religion. It also, she argues, risks the infringement of the due-process and equal-protection rights of women because much religious ideology supports gender inequality. To prohibit religious influence on lawmaking, on the other hand, risks violating the free-exercise rights of lawmakers.

Legislating Morality displays several virtues. It includes useful chapters describing recent Supreme Court rulings on religion, and the role religion plays in the political decision-making of six prominent politicians. Throughout her argument, moreover, Peach employs abortion law as her test case because, she believes, gender issues have not received enough attention in discussions of religious lawmaking. Most importantly, Peach ultimately succeeds in outlining a promising legal solution to the dilemma of religious lawmaking.

Peach announces that the aim of her book “is to advance the discussion relating to the place of religion in political life beyond its current impasse between liberal and communitarian proposals (p. 8).” Liberals typically tightly restrict the role of religious convictions in lawmaking. They often require that lawmakers bracket their personal convictions and rely on secular reasons when legislating, and sometimes require that lawmakers rely on secular motivation as well. To assess liberalism Peach discusses the views of Kent Greenawalt, and compares them to the views of John Rawls and Robert Audi, who, she believes, are less sympathetic to religion than Greenawalt. Communitarians typically permit widely shared religious convictions to contribute to the rationale for legislation. To assess communitarianism Peach discusses the views of Michael Perry, and compares them to those of Michael Sandel, who, she believes, is less respectful of pluralism than Perry. Communitarians, she concludes, generally fail to acknowledge that religious lawmaking infringes on the rights of religious minorities and women. Liberals, she claims, generally fail “to respect the moral identity and constitutional rights of religious lawmakers and communities to the free exercise of their religion (p. 5).”

The liberal and communitarian proposals to which Peach refers are embedded in a larger controversy about the viability of liberalism. In its most basic formulation liberal political philosophy maintains that individuals should be left unimpeded to pursue their conceptions of the good life. Constitutional principles, legislation, and government policy should remain neutral with regard to various substantial conceptions of the good life (as long as the pursuit of those conceptions does not impede others’ pursuit of their conceptions). Over the last twenty-five years a number of critics (sometimes called “communitarians”) have assailed the classical statements of liberal theory on the grounds that they violate the very neutrality that defines liberalism. Alasdair MacIntyre1 and Michael Sandel,2 for instance, both argue that classical liberal theory relies for its justification on controversial individualist conceptions of the self and the good life.

Kant, one prime architect of classical liberal theory, derives his liberalism from moral autonomy, the purported freedom of the noumenal self to rise above historical and empirical circumstance. J. S. Mill, whose On Liberty is perhaps the single most important work of classical liberal theory, explicitly advocates an individualist ideal in arguing for liberalism. He writes, “Where, not the person’s own character, but the traditions or customs of other people, are the rule of conduct, there is wanting one of the principle ingredients of human happiness, and quite the chief ingredient of individual and social progress.”3 MacIntyre and Sandel believe that classical liberalism’s false neutrality entails that liberal states enforce a bias against conceptions of the good life that place a greater premium on custom, tradition, and meaningful communities than on individualism. “Liberalism,” MacIntyre says,

in the name of freedom imposes a certain kind of unacknowledged domination, and one which in the long run tends to dissolve traditional human ties and to impoverish social and cultural relationships. Liberalism, while imposing through state power regimes that declare everyone free to pursue whatever they take to be their own good, deprives most people of the possibility of understanding their lives as a quest for the discovery and achievement of the good, especially by the way in which it attempts to discredit those traditional forms of human community within which this project has to be embodied.4

Far short of its stated neutrality, liberalism deceptively disables non-individualist conceptions of the self and its good.

In response defenders of liberalism have sought justifications of a liberal polity that do not “discredit traditional forms of human community.” Some have appealed to Christian theology. So-called Augustinian liberals justify liberalism with what Charles Taylor has called “hyper-Augustinian reasons, that in this fallen world of depraved wills, such a modus vivendi is the least dangerous arrangement.”5 Augustinian liberals demonstrate that one need not be a theological liberal to be a political liberal. Needless to say, however, an Augustinian justification of liberalism relies on a controversial conception of the self and its good, albeit not necessarily an individualist one.

Others, like Rorty,6 Stout, and Larmore point to a “minimal moral conception”7 or “self-limiting consensus on the good”8 shared by individualists and those who criticize individualism alike. They appeal to this shared moral consensus to claim that that we have no alternative to a liberal political order “both achievable by acceptable means and clearly better than what we have now.”9 This variety of liberalism (labeled “pragmatic liberalism” by Rorty and Stout) relies on the existence of a political community dedicated to extending equal respect to all its members, whatever their substantial conceptions of the good life. For pragmatic liberals, liberalism is a strictly political doctrine, not a comprehensive philosophical doctrine about the self and the sources of value.

This distinction that pragmatic liberals draw between liberalism as a merely political doctrine and liberalism as a comprehensive philosophical doctrine sheds light on Legislating Morality: Pluralism and Religious Identity in Lawmaking. Despite identifying liberalism with one element of the “impasse” she seeks to move beyond, Peach’s standpoint is clearly liberal in the most fundamental sense. She wants to leave individuals unimpeded to pursue their conceptions of the good life. Her complaint with both the “liberal” and “communitarian” proposals is that they impede some individuals’ pursuit of their conceptions of the good life. Communitarian proposals trespass on liberal rights. Likewise, liberal proposals do not live up to the neutrality they profess. Liberals who would prohibit religious lawmaking disadvantage those whose “moral identity”—i.e. their conception of the self and the good—precludes their bracketing their religious convictions when participating in civic life. Essentially, Peach’s objection to “liberal” proposals concerning religious lawmaking reprises the more general communitarian objection to classical liberalism: liberalism is not neutral with respect to conceptions of the self and the good life.

Peach finds herself in the situation that Rorty, Stout, and Larmore intend pragmatic liberalism to address (but, significantly, none of the three appear in her bibliography): her outlook is liberal, but she acknowledges the justice of the communitarian concern about the neutrality of much liberal theory. Pragmatic liberalism counsels a political solution and abjures any justificatory role for controversial philosophical conceptions about what the self can or should do. It allows that one might wish to paint a philosophical portrait of the self to accord with one’s liberalism, but one should not justify a liberal program by recourse to a philosophical conception of the self. Politics, Rorty insists, should take priority over philosophy. “[T]he philosopher of liberal democracy,” he writes, “may wish to develop a theory of the human self that comports with the institutions he or she admires. But such a philosopher is not thereby justifying these institutions by reference to more fundamental premises, but the reverse: He or she is putting politics first and tailoring a philosophy to suit.”10

In the specific case of religious lawmaking, a pragmatic liberal need not have a view about the possibility, necessity, or advisability of lawmakers relying only on secular reasons and motivations, but will seek to develop and buttress political institutions that protect liberal freedoms. From the perspective of pragmatic liberalism, the vigorous debate in liberal theory about religious reasons is largely misguided. A liberal, on this view, should not seek to restrict conceptions of moral identity in the political arena (providing that they do not impede others’ pursuit of their conceptions of the good life).

In separate chapters Peach outlines two alternative strategies for resolving the dilemma of religious lawmaking and moving beyond the impasse. The first is theoretical; the second legal. In the first she “proposes” that a “conception of moral identity based on George Herbert Mead’s” philosophy “offers the basis for a more accurate and workable theory for addressing the dilemma of religious lawmaking (p. 140).” Mead contends that the individual self develops out of the internalized attitudes of the social group, yet also acquires independence and autonomy through this process. A moral self, furthermore, takes into account the interests and roles of other selves as well as its own. Peach claims that Mead’s philosophy retains the best of liberal and communitarian conceptions of the self, while tempering their respective weaknesses.

In sum, Mead’s theoretical understanding of moral identity improves on liberal and communitarian approaches by positing a self that is both socially constructed and an independent individual agent with a separate and unique identity. Mead’s conception of moral identity avoids the undue emphasis on the individuality of the self found in liberal theory as well as the total and unrelenting sociality of selfhood found in communitarianism. (p. 147)

Mead’s theory does indeed avoid the implausible extremes to which liberal and communitarian theorists are sometimes drawn (though his is not the only available via media). Despite what Peach seems to believe, however, Mead’s philosophy cannot avail in resolving the dilemma. Mead simply provides one more controversial conception of the self and its good. Why should dyed-in-the-wool communitarians (or classical liberals for that matter) find it any more acceptable than a radically individualist conception? To justify liberalism on grounds derived from Mead is no more neutral than to justify it on grounds derived from Kant. Peach may find them more congenial; others may not. Rather than attempting to use it as a justification for liberalism, she would be wiser to follow Rorty’s counsel and adopt Mead’s philosophy simply because it “comports with institutions she admires.”

Peach in fact recognizes that Mead’s philosophy may not appeal to some religious legislators, and that to expect them to act in light of it constrains their free exercise as much as the liberal proposals she finds objectionable. Thus, she supplements her theoretical strategy with a “practical legal strategy” intended to improve the jurisprudence of the Supreme Court (p. 157). She proposes a modified and expanded Establishment-Clause test. Though, as Peach points out, recent Establishment-Clause rulings have not invoked it, the Supreme Court’s ruling in Lemon v. Kurtzman set the traditional standard.11 In the Lemon ruling Chief Justice Burger enumerates the criteria for a constitutional statute under the Establishment Clause. “First, the statute must have a secular legislative purpose; second, its principal or primary effect must be one that neither advances nor inhibits religion…; finally, the statute must not foster ‘an excessive government entanglement with religion’.” The first criterion, as the court applies it in the ruling, invalidates laws when “the legislative intent was to advance religion.” The Lemon ruling also asserts that “political division along religious lines was one of the principal evils against which the First Amendment was intended to protect….The potential divisiveness of such conflict is a threat to the normal political process….” Concern for government neutrality in order to avoid conflict informs the Court’s case law (even since the desuetude of the Lemon test), and Peach takes it as paramount.

Her proposal aims both to rectify shortcomings she perceives in the secular purpose requirement, and to place the Court’s concern about divisiveness at the very heart of Establishment-Clause jurisprudence. To invalidate legislation because the legislators harbored religious intent infringes on the free exercise rights of legislators, Peach argues. On her model (to give but the barest outline), evidence of religious influence on a statute, in conjunction with the presence of what she calls “Establishment Concerns,” which arise when the statute “has effects that are alienating, exclusionary, coercive, and/or politically divisive,” presumptively invalidates the statute (p. 160). The State can sustain the suspect statute by demonstrating that it has a “substantial secular justification or rationale” for it (p. 160). If the statute, in addition to exhibiting religious influence and raising Establishment Concerns, also “infringes on a constitutionally protected right of citizenship,” the State’s burden rises (p. 160). The state must demonstrate “that it has a compelling secular State interest in effectuating the subject of the enactment that cannot be achieved through the use of less restrictive means” (p. 160).

Unlike the Lemon test, Peach’s test does not automatically invalidate religiously influenced laws. It invalidates only those that raise Establishment Concerns or infringe on citizenship rights, and that the government cannot justify with a secular rationale (of the proper weight). Peach’s proposal is more neutral than the Lemon test. It does not discriminate against those who feel morally compelled to bring their religious convictions to bear on their politics. It also quite properly focuses attention on the potentially divisive consequences of religiously influenced laws. Promoting jurisprudence with these emphases represents a true (pragmatic) liberalism: devising political institutions that best preserve individuals’ freedom to pursue their conceptions of the good life.

Pragmatic liberalism only flourishes, however, where the individuals and communities with divergent conceptions of the good that compose the political community wish to live together in one state, and are willing to extend equal respect to one another. Insofar as pragmatic liberalism permits controversial reasons and motivations to enter the political arena (and then sometimes thwarts them), it endangers the consensus on which it relies. The presence in the public sphere of “opinion-making” men and women working, as William James put it, to “inflame the civic temper” and rouse public spiritedness becomes all the more vital.12 Pragmatic liberalism does not require a commitment to a particular moral identity but does require a commitment to a political community and its liberal institutions. Lucinda Peach’s legal approach provides the blueprint for a liberal political solution to the dilemma of religious lawmaking. Responsibility for maintaining the political community necessary to sustain such a solution, however, rests on all of us alike.


1. Alasdair MacIntyre, After Virtue, 2d ed. (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame, 1984).

2. Michael Sandel, Liberalism and the Limits of Justice (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982).

3. John Stuart Mill, On Liberty (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1978), p. 54.

4. From an interview in Giovanna Borradorri, The American Philosopher (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1994), p. 143.

5. Charles Taylor, “Cross-Purposes: The Liberal-Communitarian Debate,” Philosophical Arguments (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1995), p. 198. See the discussion of Gilbert Meilaender in Jeffrey Stout’s Ethics After Babel (Boston: Beacon Press, 1988), pp 233-236. See also Paul Weithman, “Toward an Augustinian Liberalism,” in Gareth Matthews, ed., The Augustinian Tradition (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1999) pp. 304-322.

6. Richard Rorty, “The priority of democracy to philosophy,” Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).

7. Charles Larmore, The Morals of Modernity (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), ch. 6.

8. Stout, chs. 9, 10.

9. Ibid., p. 229.

10. Rorty, p. 178.

11. 403 U.S. 602 [1971].

12. William James, “The Moral Equivalent of War,” Memories and Studies (London: Longmans, Green, and Co., 1912), pp. 292, 293.