Leibniz, God and Necessity

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Michael Griffin, Leibniz, God and Necessity, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 204pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521117081.

Reviewed by Michael Futch, University of Tulsa


This book is an examination of the modal metaphysics of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, with the central focus on Leibniz's views on necessity, and especially his views on the necessity of the world's existence. Defending an interpretation that appears to run orthogonally to both Leibniz's oeuvre and the broader aims of his philosophy, Griffin maintains that "Leibniz and Spinoza share the same position with respect to the question of whether everything actual is necessary" (68). Leibniz, in short, is every bit the necessitarian that Spinoza is.

As Griffin explains it, necessitarianism is the view that what is metaphysically possible is actual, and that what is actual is metaphysically necessary (58, 80). Hence, what is metaphysically possible is also metaphysically necessary. Moreover, what is non-actual is non-actual in virtue of being metaphysically impossible. Given this, the case for construing Leibniz as a necessitarian seems doomed from the start. How can a philosopher who postulates the being of infinitely many possible but non-actual worlds also be committed to the notion that the world that exists is the only metaphysically possible world, and that it exists as a matter of metaphysical necessity? Indeed, Griffin notes in the opening pages that Leibniz appears to be committed to two incompatible theses, necessitarianism and the plurality of possible worlds (3). Could the preeminent modal metaphysician of the early modern period have been so confused about the implications of two such central doctrines as to fail to recognize their mutual inconsistency? Or is Leibniz, instead, dissimulatingly maintaining the patina of piety while secretly harboring theologically unorthodox views indistinguishable from those of Spinoza?

If Griffin is right, the answer to both of the above questions is, "No." Leibniz's doctrine of possible worlds does not run afoul of his necessitarianism, a necessitarianism that is dissimilar to that of Spinoza in a way that preserves his more conventional theological commitments. To resolve the appearance of inconsistency, Griffin draws a distinction between what he terms "intrinsic" and "extrinsic" necessity and possibility. Something is intrinsically necessary if the reason for its necessary existence is contained in itself, and it is extrinsically necessary if the reason for its necessary existence is contained in something external to it. Griffin is at pains to point out that this distinction should not be understood as one between degrees of necessity, since they both are forms of metaphysical or absolute necessity (3, 73). Rather, the difference is one between reasons or explanations for something being necessary (65): what is extrinsically necessary is absolutely necessary not because of its own nature but because its existence is entailed by something else whose existence is absolutely necessary. A similar distinction can be made between intrinsic possibility (there being nothing in a thing's concept or essence that is self-contradictory) and extrinsic possibility (something being compatible with what is metaphysically necessary). Crucially, Griffin contends that what is intrinsically possible is neither intensionally nor extensionally equivalent to what is metaphysically possible, for a thing that is possible because its concept is free of internal contradiction can be metaphysically impossible because it is incompatible with something that is metaphysically necessary (81, 85). We can therefore speak of something being intrinsically possible but extrinsically, i.e. metaphysically, impossible.

With these distinctions in hand, Griffin seeks to resolve the tension between Leibniz's necessitarianism and his doctrine of possible worlds. In short, possible worlds are intrinsically but not metaphysically possible. They are intrinsically possible because they are collections of compossible substances, but metaphysically impossible because their existence is precluded by something that is metaphysically necessary. Granting for the moment that this reading of Leibniz absolves him of the charge of inconsistency, we are still left with the question of why he should be construed as maintaining that the actual world is necessary and the only metaphysically possible world.

Griffin's defense of his interpretation starts with an analysis of what he takes to be the implications of Leibniz's commitment to the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR) and certain views about how God acts. Specifically, God, whose existence is intrinsically necessary, necessarily (because of the divine nature and the need for a sufficient reason) chooses the best, and given that whatever is necessarily entailed by something necessary is itself necessary, the actual world, as the best possible world, is itself necessary (5, 53, 59). Of course, the world's existence is only extrinsically necessary, but Griffin asserts that it is nonetheless metaphysically and absolutely necessary, and that any other world, or nothing at all, is metaphysically impossible (83). Further, for something to be possible, it must not only be in God's absolute power to make it so, but also within his ordained power (86, 106).

In explaining how this position does not collapse into Spinozism, Griffin argues that while Leibniz is in agreement with Spinoza that what is metaphysically possible is metaphysically necessary, he adopts a decidedly non-Spinozist stance in seeing the metaphysically necessary existence of the world as grounded in God's providence. Writes Griffin: "The God of the pious is a God whose creative decisions are guided by wisdom and goodness. Leibniz's philosophical piety implies that these essential features entail that God chooses the best. And the actual world's existence (necessarily) follows from this" (68; see also 5).

Almost all of the texts on which Griffin bases the above claims are from Leibniz's early period, including many from the mid- to late-1670s when Leibniz was very much under the spell of Spinozism and still negotiating the differences between his views and those of his Dutch contemporary. One can therefore not assume that they are representative of Leibniz's later philosophy. This is especially so given how easily texts from around or after 1685 that, taken at face value, squarely contradict Griffin's interpretation can be marshaled. Here are a few. In his fifth letter to Clarke from 1716, Leibniz informs his correspondent that

when God chooses the best, what he does not choose . . . is still possible. But if what he chooses were absolutely necessary, any other would be impossible, which is against the hypothesis . . . to say that God can only choose the best, and to infer from this that what he does not choose is impossible, is to confuse terms: namely, power and will, metaphysical necessity and moral necessity, essences and existences (Leibniz's fifth letter to Clarke, sections 9 and 10).

In an earlier text, we find Leibniz recounting how he was once "close to the view of those who think that everything is absolutely necessary," only to immediately add that "the consideration of possibles that are not, were not, and will not be, brought me back from this precipice," concluding that it is erroneous to hold that "everything that never exists [is] impossible ("On Freedom," in Ariew and Garber, 94). Taken together, these texts deny that the actual world is metaphysically or absolutely necessary and that what doesn't exist is impossible.

Do they undermine Griffin's reading? Perhaps not, for it is open to see the apparent discrepancies between his reading and Leibniz's texts as being the result of terminological, not substantive, differences. This is precisely the strategy for which Griffin opts, remarking that at least sometimes Leibniz uses terms such as "metaphysically possible" to refer to what Griffin calls "intrinsically possible " (100; see also 48). So too, we can conjecture, Leibniz uses the phrase 'absolutely necessary' to refer to what Griffin calls 'intrinsically necessary'. Thus, when Leibniz announces his rejection of the thesis that everything that exists is absolutely or metaphysically necessary, he is simply disowning the idea that everything is intrinsically necessary, and when he insists that what does not and never will exist is not impossible, he is saying nothing more than that it is not intrinsically impossible. There is certainly a case to be made, though Griffin doesn't make it, that Leibniz's early distinction between hypothetical and absolute necessity maps onto Griffin's distinction between extrinsic and intrinsic necessity. Even so, it strikes a discordant note to find an interpreter of Leibniz using precisely the same terms as Leibniz but in a completely different sense (for Leibniz, what is hypothetically/extrinsically necessary is contrasted, not identified, with what is absolutely or metaphysically necessary).

Of even greater concern is the book's almost complete silence about much of the complex and varied conceptual repertoire of which Leibniz avails himself in explicating the distinction between necessary and contingent truths. For example, beginning with texts from the 1680s, Leibniz avers that metaphysically necessary truths can be demonstrated in finitely many steps and are grounded upon the principles of identity and contradiction, whereas contingent truths cannot be demonstrated, even by God, because they involve an infinite analysis. I will not rehearse the details of this part of Leibniz's philosophy here except to note that some scholars have suggested that he employs his theory of infinite analysis to show that there is no necessity in God creating this world because its "bestness" cannot be demonstrated. Griffin alludes to the theory of infinite analysis just once (85), and then only for purposes of saying that he will not discuss it.

Along these same lines, Leibniz also writes often of "reasons that incline without necessitating," another part of his theories of contingency enlisted to establish that there is no metaphysical necessity in God creating this world: "I say that motives incline without necessitating and that there is . . . not an absolute necessity in contingent things" (Leibniz's fifth letter to Clarke, section 9). Again, some have found in this, especially when integrated into Leibniz's theory of infinite analysis, an attempt to show that the world's existence is not metaphysically necessary, even if by that we mean extrinsically necessary. Griffin critically addresses neither Leibniz's writings on this score nor the available scholarly literature. It would be going too far to conclude that there are no interpretative strategies that can square Leibniz's myriad writings on the contingency of the world's existence with the kind of necessitarianism Griffin ascribes to him, but one wishes that the book had more engagement with a broader range of texts on Leibniz's own terms.

While the above constitutes the core of the book, Griffin delves into a number of other topics as well. The opening chapter provides a careful reconstruction of Descartes' ontological argument, showing that it leans heavily on God's omnipotence in establishing his necessary existence. This is followed in the next chapter with a nuanced investigation of Leibniz's own version of the ontological argument. Here, Griffin convincingly makes the case that Leibniz's theory of striving possibles provides a general account of existence, including the existence of God and creatures alike. This links Leibniz's version of the ontological argument with Descartes' in that it, too, relies upon God's power in demonstrating his existence.

The closing chapters of the book are devoted to an exploration of Leibniz's writings on middle knowledge, placing them against the backdrop of those of his Dominican and Jesuit predecessors. The crux of the dispute is the way in which God knows propositions about what free creatures will do in the actual world or, counterfactually, propositions about what free creatures would do under different circumstances (subjunctive conditionals of freedom, as one commentator dubs them: If C had occurred, E would have occurred). On what is often taken to be the standard Dominican view, God knows such propositions by knowing his own volitions, and this because his volitions are causally contributory to the actions of free creatures. As understood by Jesuits such as Molina, this theory makes God's decrees sufficiently determining conditions of creaturely activity, thereby undermining human freedom. To rectify this, Molina insists that God's middle knowledge of subjunctive conditionals must be pre-volitional, meaning that it is logically prior to his volitions (133). What is more, so as to preserve a robustly libertarian conception of freedom, there is no relation of determination between the conditions stated in the antecedent and the effect stated in the consequent: given precisely the same causal antecedents, different free actions could have followed. On the question of scientia media, Griffin provides ample evidence that Leibniz tries to navigate a via media. God's providential knowledge of what creatures do is based upon his knowledge of possible world-making decrees, not the kind of particular decrees invoked by the Dominicans. Unlike the Jesuits, however, and in line with the Dominicans, Leibniz maintains that there "must be something that determines and therefore explains free actions" (164). In the case of counterfactuals, God knows their truth-value by looking at the consequences of his "possible world-actualizing decrees" in the best possible world in which the conditions in the antecedent obtain and seeing if the effect obtains (184). So, for instance, the proposition "If David were to remain in Keilah, Saul would besiege the city" is true just in case in the best possible world where David remains in Keilah, it is the case that Saul besieges the city.

Whatever misgivings one might have about Griffin's defense of Leibniz as a necessitarian, this work offers scholars of early modern philosophy a valuable entry point into modal metaphysics in the seventeenth century. Griffin's examination of the sources on which he draws is painstakingly meticulous and pellucid. Additionally, the historical narrative that he provides helps to throw Leibniz's views into fuller relief by situating them within the context of his early modern and medieval predecessors. Even, and sometimes especially, where one parts company with Griffin, this book helps to illumine many of the darker passage that Leibniz traveled on his way through the labyrinth of freedom, necessity, and contingency.