Leibniz's Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles

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Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra, Leibniz's Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles, Oxford University Press, 2014, 215pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198712664.

Reviewed by Michael Della Rocca, Yale University


The Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, according to which -- in one version -- there cannot be distinct things that are qualitatively exactly alike, can seem supremely important. On the truth or falsity of this principle (hereafter: PII) turn the issues of the nature of objects and their individuation, the nature of space, time, and matter, the possibility of innate ideas, and even the metaphysical basis of love: if, as the PII seems to imply, things are nothing over and above their qualitative character, the truth or falsity of the PII promises to shed light on the question of whether we love individuals in virtue of their qualities or whether love is instead directed fundamentally at the individuals themselves. All of these metaphysical issues and love, too! Who can deny that the PII is worthy of our philosophical attention?

However, there is a slight problem for proponents of the PII: the PII seems obviously false. What could be easier than to conceive of two perfectly similar things? And what could be more irresistible than to point out the foibles of the misguided advocates of the PII? Thus we have a cottage industry in which -- fittingly enough -- similar counterexamples to the PII are, as it were, mass-produced. No wonder the number of proponents of the PII is vanishingly small. Although this is not the occasion to develop this point, I think that these counterexamples can be effectively challenged.

A few others have thought so, too -- none more important than Leibniz who, throughout almost his entire philosophical career, developed a variety of powerful arguments for the PII. Leibniz also seeks to unfold the important philosophical work the PII can do. This is where Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra's book comes in: it promises to help us see exactly what roles the PII plays in Leibniz's thought and, by assessing Leibniz's arguments for the PII, to shed light on the significance of the PII for philosophy in general.

However, again, there's a slight problem here: in Rodriguez-Pereyra's eyes, Leibniz's arguments for the PII are uniformly inadequate and his derivation of further claims from the PII "leave[s] much to be desired" (p. 204). Leibniz's significance for understanding the philosophical issues in question may thus be at risk. I'll return to this worry at the end of the review. But before I do so, allow me to sketch some of the many achievements of Rodriguez-Pereyra's book. There are five areas I would like to highlight.

(1) One of the things for which Leibniz scholars and metaphysicians will be especially grateful is Rodriguez-Pereyra's extensive list of passages in which Leibniz formulates the PII (pp. 15-20).

(2) Another valuable aspect of the book is the clarification in chapter 2 of the meaning of the principle for Leibniz. Rodriguez-Pereyra corrects the tendency to state Leibniz's principle "as the claim that there cannot be things that share all their properties" (p. 15). This formulation presupposes the existence of properties and, as a nominalist, Leibniz would be loath to commit to properties in any robust sense. Thus it is not surprising that Leibniz usually formulates the principle as the claim that there cannot be perfectly similar things. For convenience, however, I will -- as Rodriguez-Pereyra sometimes does (e.g., p. 30) -- discuss the PII in terms of the sharing of properties.

(3) Rodriguez-Pereyra clarifies the scope of the PII. Here his central claim is that the PII "has maximal scope: it says that things -- whatever kind of things they are -- are not perfectly similar" (pp. 20-21). As Rodriguez-Pereyra argues persuasively in contrast to some interpreters, even accidents fall within the scope of the PII; that is, of course, if Leibniz is committed to accidents at all (chapter 14). Rodriguez-Pereyra notes that, in the passages in which Leibniz may seem to regard certain beings as exceptions to the PII, he is in fact discussing abstract notions or incomplete notions and not things (p. 21).

Another important issue of scope is the modal status of the PII. In many texts, Leibniz is committed to the necessity of the PII (pp. 45, 63-64, 82, 90-91). In the correspondence with Clarke, however, the evidence is mixed. At least one passage in this correspondence (Letter 4, §6) affirms the necessity of the PII (pp. 120-22). But, elsewhere (Letter 5, §§21, 25, 26), Leibniz seems to assert the contingency of the PII (pp. 123-24). Also in a letter to Bernoulli, Leibniz seems to be committed to the contingency of the PII (pp. 118-19). Rodriguez-Pereyra seeks to explain away these flirtations with contingency by considering them to be the result of the complicated dialectical contexts in those letters. Rodriguez-Pereyra concludes that "there is little evidence that Leibniz ever thought the Identity of Indiscernibles to be contingent. The plausible hypothesis is that he always thought it to be necessary" (p. 126).

The discussion of scope takes a further interesting turn when Rodriguez-Pereyra discusses the strength of the necessity of the PII. There are two different claims that can be seen as articulating the necessity of the PII. The first claim -- of weak necessity -- is that no possible world contains perfectly similar things. The second claim -- of strong necessity -- is that no possibilia (whether in the same world or in different worlds) are perfectly similar (p. 28). Rodriguez-Pereyra argues that Leibniz is, in general, committed to the strong necessity of the PII, and he devotes chapter 7 to exploring the significance of this strong necessity.

(4) A fourth major benefit of Rodriguez-Pereyra's approach is that he offers meticulous analyses of the various arguments in Leibniz for the PII (chapters 3-6, 8).

(5) Finally, Rodriguez-Pereyra details some of the implications of the PII, according to Leibniz. Thus, for Leibniz, the PII entails the incoherence of the Cartesian notion of matter (chapter 10), the rejection of material atoms (chapter 11), the rejection of absolute space and time in general and the rejection of empty space and time in particular (chapter 12), and the rejection of a Lockean tabula rasa (chapter 13). For Rodriguez-Pereyra, these implications are not as clear as Leibniz thinks and the conclusions that Leibniz tries to reach could often be reached without reliance on the PII. It is for this reason that Rodriguez-Pereyra declares that, although the PII is central to Leibniz's philosophy, it is also "inessential" to it (p. 204).

This conclusion is, of course, somewhat disappointing, but perhaps it is warranted. I will not explore this issue here. In most of the rest of this review, I want to explore some of the key claims Rodriguez-Pereyra makes in the service of the other component of his negative assessment of Leibniz's engagement with the PII, viz. the claim that Leibniz's various arguments for the PII are ineffective.

Let's focus first on Leibniz's argument (at work in Notationes Generales (1683-85) and in Discourse on Metaphysics (1686)) that seeks to derive the PII from his theory that in each true proposition the concept of the predicate is contained in the concept of the subject. According to Rodriguez-Pereyra (p. 52), Leibniz holds that this theory of truth entails that each substance has a complete concept into which are built the concepts of all the properties that are true of that substance. As Rodriguez-Pereyra notes, Leibniz seems to argue from the complete concept theory to the PII (p. 57). For such an argument to work, as Rodriguez-Pereyra notes, it's not enough to appeal to complete concepts -- for the fact by itself that substance A and substance B share the same complete concept enables us to conclude only that A and B are qualitatively exactly alike. It doesn't enable us to conclude that A and B are identical unless we add the further assumption that exact qualitative similarity is sufficient for identity. But this further assumption is tantamount to the PII or at least is enough by itself to enable us to reach the PII. Thus without the further assumption, the theory of truth and the complete concept theory do not deliver the PII, but with the further assumption, the theory of truth and the complete concept theory are not needed to derive the PII. In addition, this further assumption would not be granted by any opponent of the PII. So the argument for the PII from the theory of truth can reach the PII only by invoking a further assumption that renders the argument dialectically ineffective (pp. 59-60).

What Leibniz needs -- and what the argument from the theory of truth seems not to provide -- is a reason for thinking that qualitative similarity is a sufficient basis for concluding that A is identical to B. Let's turn to the argument for the PII in Primary Truths (1689) where Leibniz can be seen as addressing precisely this need.

The argument in Primary Truths proceeds along the following lines. Assume objects A and B are qualitatively exactly alike but non-identical. Given Leibniz's Principle of Sufficient Reason (hereafter: the PSR), according to which each fact has an explanation, there must be a sufficient reason for the non-identity. But, given their exact qualitative similarity, there can be no such explanation. The most one could say is that A is not identical to B because A has the (non-qualitative) property of being not identical to B. Such an unilluminating explanation would be rejected by Leibniz. Thus in this situation, any non-identity would violate the PSR. And so, A and B must be identical after all. J. A. Cover and John O'Leary-Hawthorne call this argument "the no-reason argument," and Rodriguez-Pereyra joins them in taking seriously the following objection: the mere fact that there is no reason for the non-identity of A and B does not mean that A is identical to B. For all that has been said so far, there is also no sufficient reason for the identity of A and B. In that case, the PSR would require us to conclude that there is no fact of the matter as to whether or not A is identical to B. So the PSR combined with the no-reason argument leaves open two possibilities: first that A is identical to B and, second, that there is no fact of the matter as to whether A is identical to B.

Because of this apparent problem, Rodriguez-Pereyra is led to propose a different reconstruction of the argument, one that offers a positive reason for identity. The positive reason for identity Rodriguez-Pereyra appeals to is the claim that qualitative similarity is sufficient for identity. However, as Rodriguez-Pereyra notes (pp. 74-75), this additional premise renders the argument dialectically ineffective: again, no opponent of the PII would grant that qualitative similarity is sufficient for identity.

This unfortunate fate awaits the argument for the PII in Primary Truths only if we think the Leibniz has no way out of the tight spot into which Rodriguez-Pereyra attempts to put the "no-reason" interpretation. That is, Rodriguez-Pereyra is led to his question-begging reconstruction because he believes that Leibniz would have to take seriously the possibility that -- if we remain with the "no-reason" style of arguing -- there is no fact of the matter as to whether A is identical to B (in a situation in which A and B are indiscernible).

But is this a possibility Leibniz would take seriously? It's hard to see that he would. The claim in question is a perfectly general claim: whenever we have indiscernible A and B, then there is no fact of the matter as to whether A is identical to B. But indiscernible objects come very cheaply: anytime we have an object -- call it "A" -- specified in terms of its qualities (including its spatial, temporal, or other kind of metaphysical location), there is an object -- call it "B" -- specified in terms of the same features. In fact, in this situation there is an indiscernible object C specified in the same terms and so on ad infinitum. So if whenever there are indiscernible objects it is indeterminate whether those objects are identical, it follows that whenever we have one object, A, it is indeterminate whether there are infinitely many others objects B, C, etc. in the same spatial, temporal, or more generally, metaphysical location.

Leibniz may be willing to grant that there is indeterminacy with regard to certain facts.[1] But even so, it seems unlikely that Leibniz would take seriously the widespread indeterminacy allowed in the scenario envisaged by Rodriguez-Pereyra's (and Cover and O'Leary-Hawthorne's) understanding of the no-reason argument. This becomes especially clear when the indeterminacy concerns the number of indiscernible selves or minds in a given location. If Leibniz would reject this indeterminacy, then he would be in a position to say that the indiscernible objects, A and B, are identical. What then would the positive reason for this identity be? Obviously, the reason would be their qualitative similarity. On this understanding, the argument in Primary Truths winds up giving a positive reason for identity after all. This reading is not conclusive, of course, but the upshot is that, before we can regard the no-reason argument as a failure, we need to explore more than Rodriguez-Pereyra does (or Cover and O'Leary-Hawthorne do) the kinds of metaphysical indeterminacy that Leibniz would be willing to allow.

This possible defense of the argument for PII in Primary Truths provides some hope that there is a direct connection between the PII and the PSR, just as Leibniz indicates. This connection sheds new light on the argument for the PII from Leibniz's theory of truth.

As we saw, Rodriguez-Pereyra argues that the theory of truth cannot lead to the PII without already presupposing the PII or something like it. But this feature of the argument need not mean that our overall assessment of the argument must be negative, for once we explore the basis of the theory of truth, we get a better perspective on that argument. Leibniz doesn't offer much of a direct argument for his theory of truth, but it is clear that he sees that theory as bound up with the PSR. In Primary Truths he derives the PSR from the theory of truth, but in the Discourse he also sees the theory of truth and the PSR as amounting to the same thing. Thus Leibniz says in Discourse §13: "all contingent propositions have reasons to be one way rather than another or else (what is the same thing [ce qui est la même chose]) . . . they have a priori proofs of their truth which render them certain and which show that the connection between subject and predicate of these propositions has its basis in the natures of both." Also -- though I don't have the space to go into this here -- an argument can be extracted from Leibniz's texts for the claims that any violation of Leibniz's theory of truth would be a violation of the PSR and that Leibniz rejects such counterexamples to his theory of truth because they would violate the PSR.[2] If the theory of truth is derived from or tantamount to the PSR, then we can see the argument from the theory of truth to the PII as supported by the PSR itself, and we can see the argument as really another version of the argument from the PSR to the PII. So, the argument from the theory of truth to the PII may not be as weak as Rodriguez-Pereyra suggests. Of course, the precise connection between the PSR and the theory of truth would require further exploration, but this is a potentially fruitful line of inquiry suggested by Rodriguez-Pereyra's approach.

Finally, some thoughts about Rodriguez-Pereyra's thoughts about the modal status of the PII. Given the central role of the PSR in supporting the PII, the modal status of the PII turns to a great extent on the modal status of the PSR. Rodriguez-Pereyra seems to regard the PSR as necessary for Leibniz (p. 82), but this is another matter that requires further exploration. Leibniz clearly sees the PSR as a ground of contingency and as undergirding divine activity. It may be that to safeguard the freedom of this activity, Leibniz cannot afford to see the PSR as necessary. In that case, the PII would not be necessary either. A fuller treatment of the modal status of the PSR seems to me to be a promising next stage of investigation before we can confidently accept Rodriguez-Pereyra's conclusion that Leibniz always treated the PII as necessary.

These kinds of questions and further topics for exploration are inevitable when one works on Leibniz. Given the intricacy of Leibniz's system and the changing nature of that system over Leibniz's career, there are always further topics to pursue, further potential grounds of Leibniz's positions to explore. It is a testament to the thoroughness and insight of Rodriguez-Pereyra's enormously valuable study that the further questions it helps to generate promise to be so fruitful.


Many thanks to Julia Borcherding for helpful comments.

[1] See J.A. Cover and John O'Leary-Hawthorne, Substance and Individuation in Leibniz, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999, pp. 190-92.

[2] See Michael Della Rocca, "Violations of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (in Leibniz and Spinoza)," in F. Correia and B. Schnieder (eds.), Metaphysical Grounding: Understanding the Structure of Reality, Cambridge University Press, 2012, pp. 139-64.