Leo Strauss and Emmanuel Levinas: Philosophy and the Politics of Revelation

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Leora Batnitzky, Leo Strauss and Emmanuel Levinas: Philosophy and the Politics of Revelation, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 304pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521861564

Reviewed by Michael Zank, Boston University


Strauss and Levinas? What do these well known, yet hitherto unrelated thinkers have in common to warrant a monograph dedicated to their juxtaposition? Both are mid-20th century Jewish thinkers whose popularity has increased in recent years; both are somehow associated with the phenomenological movement represented by Husserl and Heidegger; both of them sided with Heidegger rather than Cassirer at Davos, although only one of them repented having done so. What drives this study is none of these trivial, or not so trivial, commonalities (and differences). Rather, what ties them together is the author's interest in establishing a path toward a novel constructive Jewish theology of Jewish revelation as law, or Jewish law as revelation.

What stands in the way of this new approach to Jewish philosophy, for Batnitzky, is the well-entrenched conviction that the core philosophical value of the Jewish tradition is its prophetic ethics. One only needs to take a cursory look at the recent thematic issues of the Journal for Jewish Thought and Philosophy, edited by the Kabbala expert Elliot Wolfson, to be reminded of the centrality of ethics to modern Jewish thought. One of these journal issues was dedicated to the ethics and philosophy of religion of the neo-Kantian systematic philosopher Hermann Cohen (1842-1918) and one to Emmanuel Levinas (1906-1995).  According to Robert Gibbs, who himself has been pursuing a constructive renewal of Jewish ethical thought, Cohen, Rosenzweig, Buber, and Levinas are related by a "family resemblance" rooted in a "radicalization of ethics." If ethics is the philosophical core of Judaism, then Levinas is superior to Strauss, who is not known as an ethicist but as a political philosopher. To shift the emphasis from Levinas to Strauss means to shift the interest of Jewish thought from ethics to politics. This also entails, according to Batnitzky, a shift away from Kantian, Protestant interiority, subjectivist morality, and Christian "university metaphysics" to a more authentic consideration of "Jewish revelation" as exterior rather than interior, legal rather than moral, and political rather than philosophical, if by the latter we mean something beholden to Christian or post-Christian metaphysics. Batnitzky recommends "that Strauss's thought should be the starting point for Jewish philosophical thinking in the late twentieth century (sic) because Strauss gives a better account of the scope and nature of Jewish thought, of the content of Jewish thought, and the needs of post-Emancipation Jewry than other contemporary thinkers who are actually engaged in constructive Jewish thought" (p. xxii).

At issue, then, is the proper starting point for future constructive Jewish thought. Batnitzky follows what she believes to be Strauss's strengths and his "interest (… ) in problems and not solutions" (ibid.). "Like Strauss's own project," she writes, "this book is not a constructive attempt to erect a system of philosophy, theology, or politics. Instead, following Strauss, my aim is to raise questions about a number of assumptions in contemporary academic life, some of which rightly spill over into discussion of contemporary politics, ethics, and theology. These include first and foremost questions about the relations among philosophy, religion, and politics, in some of their historic and current constructions" (ibid.).

The fundamental intuitions Batnitzky gleans from Strauss's oeuvre may be paraphrased as follows. 1. Judaism and philosophy are based on irreconcilably opposite "attitudes" since the former requires absolute obedience to revealed law, whereas the latter represents the "unending quest for the nature of the good" (p. 5). If this is true, any attempt at reconciling Judaism and philosophy fails either as Judaism or as philosophy, and possibly represents neither. 2. Modern philosophy represents an internalization of the medieval, Thomistic coordination of philosophy and revelation, attributing to this new philosophy qualities derived from revelation. This secularization of philosophy constitutes a bastardization of both philosophy and revelation and it is based on medieval Christian metaphysics. As law, and as opposed to philosophy in the classical (pre-scholastic) sense, Judaism (or, as Batnitzky puts it, Jewish revelation) remains, or ought to remain, aloof from both the medieval and the modern forms of Christian thought. 3. The amalgamation of biblical faith and philosophical metaphysics characteristic of modern philosophy has imbued philosophy with unrealizable salvific qualities on the historical and political plane. This amalgamation comes in many forms and guises but it is the source of the utopian streak inherent in all modern political ideologies and the reason why these ideologies have all coalesced in violence and dehumanization.

While, on the surface, Levinas seems to share some of these intuitions, Batnitzky argues that on deeper consideration Levinas is committed to a thoroughly modern philosophical project that comes with all the problems diagnosed by Strauss. With regard to the first point, Levinas is described as obfuscating the difference between Judaism and philosophy (p. 5: "Judaism and philosophy do not need to be harmonized (… ) because they are already in fundamental harmony with one another.") With regard to the second point, Levinas is said to hold "a post-Christian view of revelation in which revelation is revealed through philosophy" (p. 58). And with regard to the third point, Levinas's position is described as "an illiberal irrationalism, which (… ) is philosophically incoherent and politically dangerous" (p. 85).

The book thus criticizes Levinas, who is extremely popular among students of modern and contemporary Jewish thought, and defends Strauss, who is not. Levinas is shown to be committed to a modern philosophical agenda that "conflates" religion, politics, and philosophy. The method Batnitzky applies to her reading is imitative of Strauss's; "how Strauss might respond" to "Levinas's defense of modern philosophy" is the question of Chapter 2. As a "modern" philosopher, Levinas serves as exhibit A for what Strauss has to say about modern philosophy in general, which is nothing good. In a more balanced account one might have expected Strauss to be interrogated in terms of Levinas's ethics of alterity. Levinas's "radicalization of ethics" could have been used to interrogate Strauss: what, if anything, has Strauss to say about ethics? Strauss famously professed in "A Giving of Accounts" that he was never as interested in ethics as was his friend Jasha Klein. Batnitzky emphasizes that Strauss and Levinas originated intellectually from the same place, namely, Heidegger. How then did they arrive at such a different assessment of modernity and its evils? Was the persecution of the Jews and their wholesale annihilation an event in Levinas's thinking, and was it his concern with the modern Jewish experience that caused him to regret his youthful derision of "Humbold" and "humanism" and focus his mature thought on an infinite responsibility toward the other? Be that as it may, Strauss, to the best of my knowledge -- and contrary to Batnitzky's claims -- was not shaped by persecution, exile, and Jewish suffering, and the emphasis of his thought was therefore never on the problem of our responsibility for the other. The events to which he responded, to the degree that historical events can be said to have had any influence on the development of Strauss's thought, were World War I, the Bolshevik revolution, and the much maligned Weimar republic. In Strauss's terms, Levinas may simply be said to have "crawled to the cross" of a moralizing, religionizing, and philosophizing interpretation of history, i.e., he proved weak (in a Nietzschean sense). It is this softening of Levinas that endears him to most of his readers and it is the ultra-conservative hardness of Strauss that puts them off. It is, indeed, a topos in Strauss's writing to distinguish between more and less attractive positions, with the implication that the less attractive ones may be preferable.

Leora Batnitzky prefers the less attractive one of the two eponymous heroes of her book but she wants to make him appear acceptable to an audience used to siding with Levinas. To her credit, Batnitzky does not simply dismiss the critics of Strauss but tries to provide an alternative reading, one that is somewhat familiar to readers of Kenneth Hart Green who similarly tries to build a case for Strauss as an inspiration for a neo-orthodox or radically conservative theological defense of the law. This interpretation of Strauss takes its point of departure from the only book Strauss neither wrote in English nor had translated during his lifetime, Philosophie und Gesetz (1935), which has played a major role in the reception of Strauss among students of Maimonides.

As an exposition of Strauss's thought Leo Strauss and Emmanuel Levinas is problematic. Some things about this book are merely irritating and may be the result of hasty editing, such as the sometimes confusing relation between quotations and the text they are meant to illustrate, the consistent misspelling of names (such as Voeglin instead of Voegelin), the sometimes unhelpful index, or the overly schematic paraphrases of Strauss's views, paraphrases that are usually dismissed by the author herself as presumably inadequate. What is problematic is the overall sense one comes away with that it does not really matter to Leora Batnitzky whether or not she has fully understood Strauss, as long as some of his ideas can be rallied in support of the shift in focus, in contemporary Jewish philosophy, from ethics to law. The resulting reading of Strauss's writings therefore fails on a basic level to establish Strauss's true intentions while trying to claim him as an authority. It is this lack of patience and careful differentiation that should have guided this kind of investigation, more than the attempt to muster an atheist (or perhaps nihilist) in support of religious law, which may ultimately doom this project.