Leo Strauss and the Theologico-Political Problem

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Heinrich Meier, Leo Strauss and the Theologico-Political Problem, (Marcus Brainard, trans.), Cambridge University Press, 2006, 183pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521856478

Reviewed by John McCarthy, Catholic University of America


Highly auspicious, it would seem, is the arrival of a book entitled Leo Strauss and the Theologico-Political Problem. As even the most doctrinaire of modern secularists has reason to concede, the war the Islamicists have declared on liberal democracy means to be the proof, and, pending their defeat, certainly is a proof, of the continuing political relevance of "theology" to modern political life (any war that involves both strong words and violent deeds is nothing if not a "political" problem). A related, though much more surprising, turn of events would appear to make this short book even timelier. I mean, of course, the fact that Leo Strauss's name has come to be linked by editorialists around the world with the Bush administration's response to the question the Islamicists' have put to us. While there have been signs for decades that Islamicist terrorism constituted a growing threat, who could have known that an obscure German emigré professor would someday be suspected of leading, from beyond the grave, a conspiracy to take over the Pentagon? Fortunately, a review need not have recourse to the obscure art of sortilege. Whatever Leo Strauss and the Theologico-Political Problem may happen to signify about our plight, its author clearly did not intend his short meditation to be especially timely. Heinrich Meier's ambition is, in a sense, much more modest: having identified, on the basis of Strauss's own express statements, "the theme" of his philosophizing (xiii; 3–4), he attempts "to elucidate the unifying center of Strauss's philosophical endeavor by making the cause at which his endeavor aimed its own" (xiii). That is to say, Meier does not wish merely to interpret Strauss; his work of elucidation is not envisaged principally as a hermeneutical exercise; he aims, rather, to make common cause with the philosopher (see 87); he sees himself as a partisan of sorts in a battle for something much greater than a merely accurate understanding of his author's texts.

And what is the cause that moves him, as it moved Strauss before him, to write? Nothing less than "the defense of philosophy." To that end, Meier proposes, in effect, to reenact "the confrontation" between philosophy and what he, following Strauss, takes to be philosophy's "most demanding alternative" (111). Meier has already published two deservedly well regarded books on Carl Schmitt, and one might be forgiven for thinking that his penchant for construing philosophy in the martial terms of an oppositional "either/or" derives from that thinker. But it is precisely in order to oppose Schmitt's "decisionism," and theories akin to it, that Meier enters the lists with Strauss, whose philosophizing is, of course, notorious for the various "quarrels" it makes its own. For Strauss as for Meier, moreover, the defense of philosophy is in no way a rear-guard action. Rather, and as Meier argues throughout, philosophy as Strauss conceived of it is less than fully philosophical if it refuses to take seriously the confrontation Meier aspires to recapitulate. The purpose of this confrontation is, accordingly, not so much the destruction of an enemy as deeper self-knowledge (28, 103–104). What is more, Meier evinces not the least shadow of doubt that philosophy will triumph in its elenctical combat "with its most powerful antagonists and with the most demanding alternative" (101). Thanks to his confidence in the cause he champions, or regardless of it, he tacitly offers Strauss a bit of fraternal, or comradely, correction: despite or because of Strauss' unprecedented "exposure of the exoteric-esoteric art of writing" (xi) his own writings are not as lucid or transparent as, in Meier's judgment, they could or should be. In sum, it is by making the unifying center of Strauss's thought more explicit that Meier hopes to advance the same end it means to serve (see, e.g., 15–16, and 23–24 with xix–xx and 107–108).[1]

From what, though, must Meier's Strauss defend himself? The title draws a clear enough bead upon the enemy, although some may find the hendiadys "theologico-political" a little misleading. For if the philosopher is to meet "the challenge to, and the critique of, the philosophical life posed by politics and religion," the unum necessarium, according to Meier, is the "refutation of faith," i.e., the refutation of any religion professing faith in "the omnipotent God" and "his commandment or law." Philosophy can and must "repel and refute" this religion or faith, Meier openly asserts on behalf of his predecessor, because it provides the basis for "the most powerful objection to philosophy," an objection so powerful indeed that none more powerful can even be imagined (xiii; and see 5–9). On this account of Strauss's philosophical intentions, then, the "political" plays second-fiddle. Other philosophical themes with which Strauss's name is commonly associated, though not entirely neglected, are accorded still less attention. Thus Meier tends to assume, for example, the reader's familiarity with Strauss's distinctive analysis of the differences between ancient and modern philosophy or science.

None of this is meant to suggest that the author of Leo Strauss and the Theologico-Political Problem is inattentive to the demands of responsible scholarly exegesis. Far from it. Meier demonstrates throughout an impressive familiarity with the full range of Strauss's writings, early, middle, and late. This is in keeping with his editorship of a six-volume Gesammelte Schriften, three volumes of which have appeared to date. In that capacity he has had occasion to consider at close quarters all of Strauss's publications in German, several of which have never been translated into English and remain unknown even to many of the philosopher's most devoted English-speaking readers. His work as editor has also made him privy to notable portions of Strauss's philosophical correspondence, to which the present work occasionally repairs, and to a substantial amount of unpublished material, including two lectures delivered by Strauss in the 1940s, here made more widely available for the first time.[2]

The body of Meier's study falls into four chapters. In the first and most substantive, "The Theologico-Political Problem: On the Theme of Leo Strauss" (3–51), the author spells out what he takes to be the core of Strauss's "problem," together with the "solution" (xiii) he supposes Strauss to have provided to it. The central section of the chapter is devoted to a close commentary on the second of the two unpublished lectures included in the volume, a lecture entitled "Reason and Revelation," which had been prepared for delivery at the Hartford Theological Seminary in 1948, presumably at the invitation of Löwith (xvi–xvii; and see 19). Strictly speaking, it is impossible to determine what Strauss actually said on that occasion. Meier builds his case upon two discontinuous but overlapping and thematically related fragments, running to 26 pages (141–67), and nine pages (168–79) respectively. The second chapter (55–73), "The History of Philosophy and the Intention of the Philosopher: Reflections on Leo Strauss," takes up Strauss' turn to the study of philosophy's "history." Strauss undoubtedly possessed extraordinary scholarly credentials, but Meier refuses to be taken in by the conceit he went some lengths to cultivate that he took himself modestly to be an historian of "ideas" merely. Drawing upon the other unpublished lecture included here, "Living Issues of German Postwar Philosophy," delivered at Syracuse University in 1940 (xv–xvi), Meier indicates the way in which the thinker's historical studies were expressly intended as a philosophical protreptic, necessary, in Strauss's view, in order to confront and combat the regnant historicism of his, and our, day. In his third chapter (77–87), "What is Political Theology?," Strauss's name does not appear at all, except in an indirect way, in the footnotes. The chapter provides instead what Meier describes as a "non-polemical" description of what he purports to be political philosophy's "symmetrical counterconcept" (xiv). The definition of "political theology" he provides is derived principally, if not quite exclusively, from Schmitt's political ruminations, whose dependence upon that thinker's religious ideas Meier has elsewhere done so much to document. Nor are Strauss's texts very prominent in the last chapter, "Why Political Philosophy?" (91–111), although the argument of chapter four, which seeks to show why philosophy must be "political" if it is to be true to its own calling, is plainly inspired by that philosopher above all. Meier there considers: (i) why, and in what sense, "politics" is a proper object of philosophical inquiry; (ii) the philosopher's obligation, arising from his ineluctable dependence upon political life, and from the incongruities between politics and philosophy, to defend his way of life politically, i.e., in politically respectable or comprehensible terms; (iii) how the strictly rational justification or defense of philosophy involves an ascent from, and thereby also an intrinsic dependence upon, opinions, especially the sorts of opinions that are conditioned by, and are the condition for, political life; and (iv) how "political philosophy" puts philosophy as such into question, and thereby establishes the logical space in which the philosopher can and must aspire to fuller self-knowledge.

For those suffering from the febrile delusion that Strauss is to be blamed for the war in Iraq, Meier's account of philosophy's "ownmost task," the task it "possesses as philosophy and for the philosopher" might serve as a welcome tonic, were they perchance to feel the need for it (95; and see 11–15). Still, he is not unmindful of the indirect influence Strauss has had on contemporary political life through his students, and through the students of those students. Like everything living in philosophy, Strauss's thought has attracted numerous followers, of various kinds and qualities, good, bad, and indifferent. But whatever his ultimate responsibility for any of them, he was certainly far more alert to the problem of epigones, and thought much more deeply about that problem, than any other major thinker of the last century. Indeed, Meier claims, paradoxically but not implausibly, that Strauss deliberately set out to respond to that old problem by founding, in something analogous to the ancient sense of that term, a school of philosophy. And in the "Preface to the American Edition," he offers some intriguing suggestions as to how Strauss's "political" decision to philosophize in an academic mode, conducted in full awareness of the risks it necessarily entailed, might have served the philosopher's properly philosophical intentions (xvii–xx). To be sure, Meier is guilty of hyperbole when he characterizes that founding as "the sole political endeavor, the sole political act of consequence, that Strauss brought himself to launch, after he had put" the Zionism of his youth behind him (xviii, 15). To say nothing of his other politically consequential actions, the philosopher frequently sprang, with all due sobriety, to the defense of liberal democracy, in express opposition to the innumerable theoretically trained rhapsodists, on the right and the left, for the brutal tyrannies of the last century. It is possible that Meier here engages in a little "political" activity of his own.

However that may be, a reader might correctly conclude from the preceding summary that Leo Strauss and the Theologico-Political Problem is not well suited, because in no way intended, as an "introduction" to Strauss's political philosophy. Among those of its readers already well versed in Strauss's works, some will surely find occasion to deplore what they deem to be Meier's sins of commission and omission, for as indicated, his argument largely abstracts from the particulars, and the rational engagement with particulars, that always animated Strauss's writing; but then, such complaints are congenital to every school of thought, or perhaps even a sign of good health. Somewhat more problematic, perhaps, is the fact that Meier's study not infrequently betrays its origin (xiii–xiv) in various lectures and essays. Hence a certain tendency to repetitiveness, even down to the level of particular formulations, which so far as this reviewer could determine served no logographical necessity (e.g., 71 with 103). As for the core of this book, namely, its treatment of the infamous "theologico-political problem," we limit ourselves to two brief observations.

In the first place, Meier fails to make any case for treating Carl Schmitt as the most reliable point of departure for grasping philosophy's "symmetrical counterconcept." Whatever "debate" Schmitt may have "inaugurated," one may doubt that it defines the contemporary "horizon" for reflection on the nature of "political theology." Certainly Strauss never accorded this one-time interlocutor such sovereign authority. Meier cannot help but be aware that Schmitt's credentials as a Christian "theologian" have always been highly suspect doctrinally, and not only because of his years of enthusiastic public service to the Third Reich; but for some mysterious reasons of his own, Meier believes that this in no way affects Schmitt's standing as a prophet of "the theologico-political problem." This limitation of the book points to a second. Notwithstanding Meier's desire to make Strauss's life-long "cause" his own, there is little evidence that he ever supposed "revelation" to be capable of posing any serious "objection" to his reason. In fact, he openly allows that "the challenge of revelation" to reason is, of itself, no challenge at all until the day that the philosopher has "made it strong" (xiii), indeed, has made its weaker argument "stronger than it actually is" (16–17; also 24; and see 11, and 109). One has the impression that Meier, having never been inclined to think or believe that God exists, has decided to invent him in order to enjoy the satisfaction, once and for all, of having proven him wrong.

Fortunately, and as already noted, Meier generously appends to his analysis a telling example, in Strauss's own words, of the approach the philosopher himself took to "the theologico-political problem." For this, as also for Meier's searching commentary upon it, the reader may be especially grateful. Meier is probably right to say that in the lecture on "Reason and Revelation" Strauss "dealt with" Biblical revelation "in a more outspoken way than at any time before or after"; and whether it is his most "penetrating" treatment of the theme, or not, one might well defer to Meier's judgment that it is "unique in his oeuvre" (xvi, 29). The lecture does surely stand apart from his other express considerations of the question in the way that it directly confronts Christian revelation, a subject Strauss seems generally to have handled with an argument from silence. Also quite remarkable is the lecture's bold (by Strauss's standards) and intriguing outline of a genetic "explanation" of Jewish and Christian faith in revelation. Elements of this outline are clearly visible in Strauss's later writings, but the whole of it, insofar as it is a rational whole, may very well constitute, as Meier appears to believe, a "programmatic statement" of Strauss's most considered views upon the subject (see 34, 41–43). As goes without saying, one must speak of the lecture's significance in the subjunctive voice, since Strauss saw fit neither to publish it himself, nor to revise it for posthumous publication. Even so, the inclusion of this rich fragment in Leo Strauss and the Theologico-Political Problem appears to confirm, in a way that its four chapters do not quite manage on their own, the full truth of Arnaldo Momigliano's description of Strauss. The illustrious Jewish historian all but concludes his commemoration of his former colleague with these words: "Few men have loved the faith of the fathers with so much austere love as Leo Strauss, who understood it but did not share it …"

[1] Compare Leo Strauss, "The Literary Character of the Guide for the Perplexed," in Persecution and the Art of Writing (New York: The Free Press, 1952), 55–56.

[2] Leo Strauss, Gesammelte Schriften, edited by Heinrich Meier (Stuttgart: J. B. Metzler, 1996–). The three volumes issued to date print everything Strauss published, or completed for publication, before 1938, when he quit Europe; they also include his dissertation on Jacobi, a significant amount of hitherto unpublished material from the same period, and correspondence with Gerhard Krüger, Jacob Klein, Karl Löwith, and Gershom Scholem. The two lectures included in the present work are also slated for publication in volume 4, presumably to appear some time later this year, under the title Politische Philosophie. Studien zum theologisch-politischen Problem.