Les Méditations métaphysiques de Descartes

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Denis Kambouchner, Les Méditations métaphysiques de Descartes, Presses Universitaires de France, 2005, 415pp, 19€ (pbk), ISBN 2130516254.

Reviewed by Steven Nadler, University of Wisconsin-Madison


One could easily be forgiven for thinking that we have more than enough books on Descartes's Meditations, particularly those that take the meditation-by-meditation approach and walk us slowly through the theses and arguments of the work. And yet, with his new book, the first in a projected series of three volumes and devoted primarily to the First Meditation, Denis Kambouchner adds a significant new study to this most-studied of early modern philosophical treatises.

Kambouchner takes his time in approaching the text itself and the particular arguments of the First Meditation. Rather, the first half of the book is devoted to discussion of more general themes, including the historical and philosophical context of the Meditations. Kambouchner looks closely at questions related to the work's substance and style, and considers its purpose, its method, and its audience. He examines the development of the meditation form as devotional testimony and literary technique, and provides a subtle reading of the way in which Descartes employs that form for his own philosophical purposes. He notes the differences and the similarities with antecedents in Augustine and Anselm (with whose spiritual exercises Kambouchner assimilates, to some degree, Descartes's first-person "analytic" -- as opposed to "synthetic" -- undertaking) and other religious authors. He also, in these opening chapters, lays out a persuasive case for the unity of the Meditations and the Objections/Replies, showing how both are equally essential elements in the presentation of Descartes's metaphysical project, albeit without undermining the independence of the text of the six meditations itself.

Above all, Kambouchner's "Introduction Générale" offers an insightful reconstruction of the context of metaphysics in the pre-Cartesian world and examines the various and often competing senses of 'metaphysics' employed therein (science of being, science of God, etc.). Kambouchner wants to persuade us that, rather than thinking in terms of a "Cartesian revolution" in philosophy, we should look at Descartes as offering a "reinvention of metaphysics", one that can be understood only in the light of late medieval developments. This, he insists, somewhat paradoxically but with perfect justification, will give us a better sense of Descartes's originality. Suarez is an important character in this story, for, according to Kambouchner, it was he who simplified and generalized metaphysics into the study of "being insofar as it is real being", including among its objects infinite being, that is, God, and thus making theology a subset of metaphysical inquiry.

For Descartes, in Kambouchner's view, metaphysics is not the science of being qua being, but rather the accomplishment of a particular foundational task through the methodical treatment of certain immaterial and thus metaphysical objects (especially God and the human soul, including the principles of knowledge). In this regard, there is no distinction, for Descartes, between metaphysics and first philosophy. To the question so often asked by recent French scholars, "Is Descartes truly a metaphysician?" or "Does Descartes belong to the history of metaphysics?", Kambouchner answers with a definite 'yes', but not by showing how Descartes is doing metaphysics in the Scholastic sense of the term. "La métaphysique de Descartes pourra donc bien n'être pas de la meme espèce que celle de l'École … mais si l'on convient d'appeler 'métaphysique' la demarche d'un esprit qui sait atteindre, comme dira Leibniz, au "fond des choses", ou du moins constituer un tel fond, et traiter de chaque chose à partir de ce fond, il [sera] ridicule de disputer à Descartes la qualité de métaphysicien" (90).

One of the more interesting of these early chapters is the one in which Kambouchner investigates the objet or purpose of the Meditations, and here he goes beyond the perfunctory treatment usually accorded this question in similar books. He takes seriously the apologetic nature of the work with respect to the proofs of God's existence and the immortality of the soul (whereby Descartes's target is the libertine or atheist). "La contribution des Méditations à la 'cause de la Religion' est-elle donc chose qu'il faut renoncer à prendre au sérieux? Nullement … [A]ux yeux de Descartes, aucun lecteur attentive de ces Méditations ne pourra manquer d'acquérir de l'existence de Dieu et de l'immortalité de nôtre âme une très parfaite certitude" (74). He also examines with great care the work's function in providing epistemological and ontological foundations for Cartesian mechanistic science (whereby the target is the Scholastic professor wedded to the Aristotelian system). As for whether or not one of Descartes's targets is also the skeptic, as has been often claimed (most notably by Popkin and Curley), here Kambouchner is himself a bit more skeptical. He argues that, rather than the Pyrrhonian, the more likely opponent here, because he represents a greater danger to Descartes's scientific program, is the probablistic empiricist (such as Gassendi).

Of course, the real work in any book such as this comes with the analysis of the meditations themselves. Kambouchner succeeds here beautifully. He does a fine job in his examination of the First Meditation of providing both the basic explanations needed for enlightening the novice and the more complex inquiries expected by the seasoned specialist. He begins by offering a defense of Descartes against the charge that he misconstrues the nature and structure of human knowledge, and also provides a plausible justification for Descartes's use of the method of doubt. In his thorough consideration of this method, Kambouchner looks at the process or experience of doubting itself, the obstacles to be overcome (e.g., the force of habit in our everyday beliefs) and the means of overcoming them, and the nature of the doubt ultimately engendered by the method (contrasting it, for example, with the state of epokhé pursued by ancient skepticism). Kambouchner is especially good in these sections at bringing to our attention certain tensions, inconsistencies, and problems in Descartes's text(s) and in proposing plausible resolutions for them. He is interested in, among other things, the perennial question of whether or not the reasons for doubt are (to cite Descartes himself) "hyperbolic and ridiculous" or "very strong and quite considerable", as well as in the issues of who exactly the meditator is supposed to be and whether all of the principles subjected to the method of doubt in the First Meditation are intended to be empirical ones, grounded in either the naïve or critical use of the senses.

Finally, Kambouchner turns to the particular arguments of the First Meditation, those intended to instill in the meditator the epistemological doubts from which the cogito and the existence of God are to provide the fulcrum for his rescue. Kambouchner generally adopts a careful, level-headed approach. He is sensitive to the variety of texts that must be used when offering a deep interpretation of the Meditations (the Rules for the Direction of the Mind, the Discourse on Method, the Search After Truth, the "Conversations with Burman", etc.) and to the different ways in which they must be brought into play. He also tends to avoid extremes in his interpretations, and does not have any obvious axes to grind.

Two elements of this part of his book are especially noteworthy. First, Kambouchner offers a very sensible answer to the question of the relationship between the deceiving God argument and the doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths. He takes exception to a common scholarly tendency to closely link the two. He grants that they have between them "un air de famille" that makes a "rapprochement" inevitable -- indeed, they both derive from a recognition of God's omnipotence. But this should not lull us into overlooking crucial differences between them, what Kambouchner calls an "opposition diamétral qui est aussi une essentielle dissymétrie" (327). In essence, not only is it the case that one doctrine has God creating truths while the hypothesis of "Dieu trompeur" has God creating falsehoods, but the power of the "Dieu trompeur" is something we can basically grasp, if not fully comprehend, while the notion of God's power to make it not be the case that 2+2=4 "envelloppera un paradoxe insupportable".

Second, Kambouchner addresses the relationship between the hypothesis of "Dieu trompeur" and the fiction of the "malin génie", the evil deceiver. Here, too, Kambouchner resists a simple identification of the two. These possible sources of deception not only work in different ways, he insists, but they represent very different kinds of relationship to some powerful being. Kambouchner argues, first, that the power of the evil deceiver should not, despite appearances, be confused with the omnipotence of God. He then claims that because the deceiving God is depicted as the creative source of our being, hence of our systematically unreliable faculties, such a divinity would be much more remote from us than an evil deceiver who, on Kambouchner's reading, is intimately involved in causing our particular illusions, being the instigator of our non-veridical experience or representations of things. Above all, he concludes, an all-powerful but deceiving God is, in fact, something incomprehensible, a self-defeating hypothesis (as Descartes hopes to show in his subsequent proof that God cannot be a deceiver), whereas the evil deceiver is, while hyperbolic, still quite conceivable, particularly since this deceiver runs up against the limits of my will insofar as he cannot actually force me to believe anything.

There is something missing from Kambouchner's discussion here, however. He recognizes that, on at least one occasion, in the conversation with Burman, Descartes says that the evil deceiver has created him ("me creavit"). So why should there necessarily be these differences of mechanics and of proximity or intimacy between the two hypotheses? Perhaps the evil deceiver argument does indeed work in the same way as the "Dieu trompeur" argument works: the deceiver has maliciously created me with faulty faculties. On this reading, the evil deceiver hypothesis is substituted for the deceiving God hypothesis only to avoid attributing (incoherently and impiously) such malice to God. Kambouchner seems to be aware of this possibility of assimilating the two hypotheses, suggested by Descartes's remarks to Burman (365), but he does not address it seriously.

One of the virtues of this book, all too rarely found in the French literature on Descartes, is a real engagement with English-language scholarship. This is, without question, one of the best books on the Meditations to appear in a long time. It is certainly the finest, and most thorough, treatment that the First Meditation has received since Harry Frankfurt's Demons, Dreamers and Madmen (which was, incidentally, as far as I know, the first study of Descartes by an Anglo-American philosopher to be translated into French). The three-volume work should, when completed, become one of those magisterial studies (like Gueroult's two-volume masterpiece, Descartes selon l'ordre des raisons) that is standard reading for generations. I am very much looking forward to the next two installments.