Levinas and the Crisis of Humanism

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Claire Elise Katz, Levinas and the Crisis of Humanism, Indiana University Press, 2013, 221pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253007650.

Reviewed by Annabel Herzog, University of Haifa


It's a question posed again and again by readers of Levinas, especially those at an early stage of their studies: "What do the face-to-face and substitution really mean? What are their concrete, practical implications?" Levinas's ethics holds that each of us has absolute responsibility for the Other, even to the point of self-sacrifice. But did Levinas really mean that people should sacrifice their own well-being for the sake of others -- for neighbors, even for strangers? His answer is well-known: "It is an original 'After you, sir!' that I have tried to describe" (Ethics and Infinity, translated by Richard Cohen, Duquesne University Press, 1985, p. 89). To many people this playful reply sounds "polite" enough but perhaps less ethical than evasive . . . une pirouette, the French would say. Did we really need the long and complex pages of Totality and Infinity, Otherwise than Being, and Of God Who Comes to Mind to learn how to hold the door for the next passerby? The great achievement of Claire Katz's new book, Levinas and the Crisis of Humanism, is to explain the meaning of Levinas's ethics in a way that makes it relevant for everyday life without either simplifying it or resorting to the paraphrase that is so often the pitfall of Levinas scholarship.

The question that pervades Katz's work concerns the process of becoming ethical: "How does one develop ethically?" (p. 19). This question reflects an understanding of ethics as a dynamic process, one that cannot content itself with merely describing the transcendent relationship of the subject with the Other, but that must explain how, concretely, to build the face-to-face, linking together "education, teaching, ethics, religion, and the political" (p. 161). Katz's book, therefore, is not just "another book on Levinas," another account of the basic concepts of his philosophy. It integrates this philosophy into larger concerns, showing how Levinas's ethics is founded on and expressed in tangible practices.

If Levinas's project consists of a "radical revision of ethical subjectivity" (p. 1), this process of revision must take material form somewhere. Katz argues that the location of the change is education. Focusing on Levinas's essays on Jewish education no less than on his famous philosophical works, she demonstrates that his ethics calls for a "radically different educational system" (p. 13). The focus on what scholars generally label Levinas's "Jewish writings" is enlightening and produces a fresh understanding of Levinas's work. In particular, Katz resolves the persistent uncertainty in Levinas scholarship about "the relationship of Levinas's Jewish texts to his larger philosophical project" (p. 9). Katz shows that, in Levinas's work, the recourse to "Jewish education" is meant to create a "new humanism" as an answer to the crisis of modern humanism founded on rights, that is, ultimately on individualism and egoism. As she accurately puts it, Levinas is not

interested in a moral perfection that is solely about the cultivation of a self as such -- a self with a well-trained body, a self that does not waste its talents, a self that is patient, perseveres, or is prudent. This is to say, he is not concerned with a self that is concerned with itself. (p. 123)

Interestingly, in the first chapter Katz engages not with Levinas, but with contemporary controversies about education. What is at stake is not the crisis of humanism, but rather that of the humanities in Western curricula. She presents different models of education exemplified in the works of Arendt, Dewey, and Nussbaum. For Arendt, whom Katz defines as "conservative," education has no direct political function. Politics is the realm of free and spontaneous innovation, while education is meant to establish a bond between a child and his or her history, culture, and tradition, and, in general, the world as it is. Politics means creating (and therefore transforming) the present and the future; education is about the past. Yet for Arendt, education -- though not in itself political -- is necessary to politics, which cannot flourish in a society whose members lack an understanding of history and tradition. In contrast to Arendt, Dewey's "progressive education" emphasizes the process or mode of teaching rather than the material taught. Dewey's point -- as Katz argues -- is that the learning process and the acquisition of skills are central to a moral education. For Dewey, while education must not neglect the transmission of knowledge, education is in itself a democratic practice, rather than being simply a prerequisite for democracy, as for Arendt. Nussbaum, attempting to synthesize Dewey and Socratic pedagogy, argues that greater emphasis on teaching the humanities is critical to ensuring the preservation of democracy. However, claims Katz, Nussbaum's intellectual elitism undermines her democratic intentions.

According to Katz, this discussion about the humanities and the normative essence of education leaves open several fundamental questions: "Should education be about teaching a skill; should it cultivate the mind; should it do both; does it have an inherent moral dimension?" (37). Therefore, in her second chapter Katz turns to Rousseau and Nietzsche, leaving the humanities to discuss modern humanism and its accent on self-sufficiency. In a subtle and sophisticated way, Katz shows that Rousseau, who "inaugurate[d] two major trends in contemporary education -- the Montessori movement and Deweyan pragmatism" (41) -- and who influenced the theory of rights and French Republicanism, developed, in Emile, a philosophy of self-sufficiency largely founded on gender. Rousseau champions an autonomy that is largely a male characteristic. Pursuing that line of thought, Nietzsche, in Zarathustra, also depicts an education that promotes individual independence. Both Rousseau and Nietzsche de-valorize the teaching role of the community and advocate educational processes that are cut off from the affairs of the city -- i.e., from civic and communal life. How then, should we expect citizens to be involved in moral and political challenges?

In the chapter "The Crisis of Humanism," Katz reviews the main themes of Levinas's critique of humanism. Analyzing his early and later assessments of Christianity, liberalism, and Marxism, she shows how Levinas's analysis of self-sufficiency and emancipation led him to the philosophical question of the relationship between immanence and transcendence, which he conceptualized as ethical: human subjectivity is not independent but is "redefined as the responsibility for the Other" (73). However, if this responsibility for the other is to have any meaning, it must be cultivated, as is described in the fourth chapter of the book, "Before Phenomenology." That chapter and the two that follow, "The Promise of Jewish Education" and "Teaching, Fecundity, Responsibility," present Katz's answer to the question "How does one become the kind of ethical subject Levinas describes?" (p. 80). As Katz rightly emphasizes, Levinas contends that the cultivation of an ethical subjectivity constitutes the core of Judaism. However, I am not sure he unambiguously believed that subjectivity to be "unique to Judaism" (p. 96). It is true that often in Levinas's work, "'being Jewish' is set in opposition, or at least in contrast to, 'being Western'" (p. 92). However, despite his numerous attacks on Western philosophy, Levinas also declared on many occasions that ethics can be found in philosophy. Just as his harsh critique of politics must be seen in light of his repeated assertion that politics is the only way to implement ethics, his harsh critique of Western culture must be regarded in light of his absolute admiration for and need of Western philosophy: after all, he was a Western philosopher.

When Levinas advocates a "return" to the study of Hebrew and to Hebrew texts in order to develop a "Hebraic Humanism" (and not a "Jewish Humanism," as the translation in Difficult Freedom has it), his aim is to "raise [Judaism] to the level of a science" (Difficult Freedom, translated by Seán Hand, The John Hopkins University Press, 1990, p. 267). In other words, the project is to disclose Judaism's universal meaning. As Katz indicates, the particular characteristic of Judaism, embedded in its classical texts (Bible, Talmud, and commentaries), is to comprise a general significance "indispensable to human harmony" (Difficult Freedom, p. 276; Katz p. 111). Therefore, the "return" to Hebrew texts is in fact the creation of a new kind of education, based on old texts but open to the whole of humanity in modern times. The specificity of the Hebrew texts is that they demand exegesis. Exegetical reading is not a possible way of reading but a necessary way (pp. 141-142), and it has two consequences. On the one hand, it allows for multiple interpretations of the texts and a pluralistic approach to truth. On the other hand, but relatedly, it leads to a process of concrete dialogue opened unto the Other -- the other pupil, the teacher, the other teacher, etc. (see Beyond the Verse, translated by Gary D. Mole, Indiana University Press, 1994, p. xiii). As Katz writes, "To engage with the Bible, then, is to engage in a transcendent act" (p. 135).

The last chapter endeavors to describe an "educational model that is both necessary and comparable to the Jewish educational model which Levinas presents" (p. 150). With the help of concrete examples, Katz advocates an education based not only on dialogue (i.e., free discussion) but on interdependency, namely, on responsible dialogue: "The children must learn to rely on each other and in turn they must also learn that they are responsible for each other" (p. 162). No doubt such an education would be the best way to realize ethics, and to show that Levinas's phenomenological descriptions can make a beautiful difference in everyday life. Katz's book succeeds in transmitting a deep sense of how Levinas's philosophy is important and relevant in a world in crisis.