Levinas and the Trauma of Responsibility: The Ethical Significance of Time

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Cynthia D. Coe, Levinas and the Trauma of Responsibility: The Ethical Significance of Time, Indiana University Press, 2018, 249pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253031976.

Reviewed by Joshua Shaw, Penn State Erie, The Behrend College


Cynthia D. Coe's book is a thoughtful, well-researched, and accessible contribution to the English-language scholarship on Emmanuel Levinas's philosophy.

The book's title, as well as some of Coe's remarks in her introduction, may give the impression that it should be a read as a monograph devoted to explicating the role of time in Levinas's philosophy, particularly in relation to his understanding of responsibility. However, it is better approached, I found, as a collection of essays -- ones that tend to focus on time, trauma, and responsibility, but range over many topics, such as Levinas's concerns about Hegel's philosophy of history (Chapter 4), embodiment (Chapter 6), maternity (Chapter 7), and animality (Chapter 8), to name only a few. Overall, the book reads less like a comprehensive study of Levinas's ideas about time, or their relation to trauma and responsibility, and more like a series of thoughtful, well-researched, and well-argued essays by a very gifted Levinas scholar.

This nitpick aside, it is an excellent book. Its introduction provides a far better blow-by-blow, chapter-by-chapter, summary of its contents than I can provide. For this reason, instead of attempting to summarize, I shall focus on identifying a few key accomplishments -- reasons why I strongly recommend this book to students who are new to Levinas's philosophy as well as seasoned scholars. Suffice it to say that the book's general structure, as I read it, is that its early chapters (1-3) are devoted to explicating its focal interests, time, trauma, and responsibility, with later chapters (4-8) pursuing these themes into different areas of Levinas's philosophy. I turn now to pointing out a few of the book's merits.

First, Coe's explication of Levinas's understanding of time in the early chapters (particularly 1 and 3) is outstanding. She begins by drawing attention to a puzzle in Levinas scholarship -- one that has challenged, I think, many commentators though it has not necessarily been discussed explicitly or at length. Much of the scholarship on Levinas has focused on his ideas about alterity and responsibility, taking these to be his philosophy's foundational preoccupations. Yet time has some claim to be just as important, if not more so. One of Levinas's early important works was Time and the Other (1947). Time remained a concern in Totality and Infinity (1961). His distinction between "synchrony" and "diachrony" played a pivotal role in his second major work, Otherwise than Being (1974), and in later essays, such as "Essence and Disinterestedness" (1974) and "God and Philosophy" (1975). Coe notes that toward the end of his life, in a 1988 interview, Levinas summarized his philosophy by observing that the "essential theme of my research is the deformalization of the notion of time."[1]

Time has some claim, therefore, to be just as central and constant to Levinas's philosophy as alterity or responsibility, if not more so. Why has it received comparatively less attention in the scholarship on him?

Speaking for myself, I have tended to shy away from it because his statements about time, particularly in Otherwise than Being and other later writings, are so baffling. The general drift of many of his observations is not necessarily difficult to explain. Levinas believed that much of western philosophy has assumed a "synchronic" account of time. That is, it conceptualized time as a series of present moments, "nows," which, he believed, had contributed to a pervasive mischaracterization of responsibility. He suggests that we experience ourselves as blurred across time(s), what he calls "diachrony," in situations where we acknowledge our responsibility for others.

Imagine I am in my office, writing this review, when, from outside, I hear a blood-curdling cry for help. Before I can reflect, I bolt upright, my heart races, and I feel compelled to do something to assist, without knowing what this may entail, or even if I can, in fact, help. Levinas notes that we tend to imaginatively reconstruct such acknowledgements of responsibility -- to think of them as occurring sequentially across a series of discrete synchronic moments. First, I hear a scream. Then, my mind processes this information. Then, I deliberate. Then, I decide to help the other who is in need. Then, I act . . .

However, this reconstruction misrepresents my original acknowledgement of responsibility -- its temporality. For I felt responsible for the other person before I had a chance to deliberate or choose to accept it. Responsibility has an "always already" dimension. I don't know so much acknowledge responsibility as discover, in hindsight, I somehow already acknowledged it, as if a decision occurred in my past, but not one I can return to in memory, not a past that was ever present to me as a synchronic "now," what Levinas calls "an immemorial past." In this way, responsibility enacts a unique experience of self and time -- a premonition of oneself as not fully coinciding with oneself, as blurred across time(s), what Levinas calls "diachrony."

It's easy enough to restate the basics of these suggestions. Nor is it necessarily difficult to point out their linkages to other aspects of Levinas's thinking, which Coe does expertly throughout her book. It's another to confront head-on some of the very baffling statements he makes about time in his writings. Consider this passage from "Philosophy and Awakening" (1977):

The rational is syn-thesis, syn-chronization of the historical, that is, presence; that is, being: world and presence. The thought of rational animality is accomplished in the Idea in which history presents itself. It is toward the idea that the dialectic tends, the dialectic in which the diachronically traversed moments are recovered, that is, identified, sublimated, and conserved.[2]

I'll fess up that I am not smart enough or patient enough to decipher what Levinas is proposing about synchrony, diachrony, the Idea of history, and rational animality in this quotation. To Coe's credit, she does not shy away from tackling it (see p. 79) or others like it. Moreover, she succeeds in clarifying them. And she succeeds, I would argue, on two levels. First, she fulfills her book's opening promise of showing how the deformalization of time can be understood as an essential theme of Levinas's philosophy. Second, she goes beyond simply comparing and contrasting his ideas about time with other figures from European philosophy, or drawing attention to well-understood connections between them and other areas of his philosophy. She manages to crack some very difficult passages in Levinas's writings.

This brings me to a second accomplishment of the book. It sparkles with insights. I noted that I found it more appropriate to read Coe's book as a collection of essays revolving somewhat loosely around time, trauma, and responsibility, rather than a monograph devoted to a single overarching argument or interpretation of Levinas. Each essay included at least one "wow" moment, by which I mean a moment when Coe genuinely impressed me by achieving what I judge to be original, noteworthy contributions to the English-language scholarship on Levinas. Moments when I found myself smiling as I read her book because it had substantially deepened my understanding of Levinas.

Let me give an example. Chapter 6 explores Levinas's ideas about embodiment. I am somewhat familiar with this topic -- with scholarship that tries to clarify his account of embodiment by, say, close readings of passages from Section II of Totality and Infinity, statements about interiority and enjoyment (jouissance), or by, say, comparing and contrasting his and Maurice Merleau-Ponty's phenomenologies of embodiment. However, Coe's entry point is Levinas's very early essay "Reflections on the Philosophy of Hitlerism" (1934). She shows how for Levinas both Nazism and liberalism can be understood as manifestations of a shared anxiety about embodiment, one which, she convincingly demonstrates, Levinas sought to overcome in later writings, such as "Useless Suffering" (1982) and Otherwise than Being.

I found Coe's discussion of Levinas's account of embodiment eye-opening. Her exegesis of "Reflections on the Philosophy of Hitlerism" is topnotch. My understanding of this essay is much improved thanks to her book. More generally, her book deepened my appreciation for the role embodiment plays in his philosophy as a whole -- exposing its significance for writings I had previously taken myself to understand at least moderately well. There are no weak chapters in this book. Each one makes at least one important contribution to the secondary literature on Levinas.

Are there flaws? Possibly. I hesitate to remark on them, however, for fear of giving the wrong impression. There were moments when I found myself quibbling with some of Coe's claims or interpretations -- moments when I found myself scribbling questions in the margins of my copy of the book. None of these amounted, however, to substantive criticisms, and more often than not were not even criticisms so much as starting points for discussion.

Like much of the English-language scholarship on Levinas, the book is devoted mainly to explicating difficult passages in Levinas's works and to comparing-and-contrasting him to other figures in European philosophy. I find myself a little impatient with this tendency in English-language scholarship on Levinas to restrict itself to exegesis. However, I suspect I'm out-of-step with others on this issue. I cannot help but think that readers will find the book to be extremely helpful and valuable.

For those who are somewhat new to Levinas, it provides clearly-written, well-researched overviews of some key ideas in his thinking, chiefly time, trauma, and responsibility, but others as well, such as his methodology, philosophy of history, account of embodiment, motherhood, mortality, and animality. For Levinas scholars, Coe's book makes valuable contributions to the secondary literature in each of these areas.

[1] Levinas, "The Other, Utopia, and Justice," in Entre Nous: Thinking-of-the-Other, trans. By Michael B. Smith and Barbara Harshav, New York: Columbia University Press, 1998, 232. 

[2] Quoted on page 79 of Coe's Levinas and the Trauma of Responsibility.  The original quotation can be found at Levinas, "Philosophy and Awakening," Entre Nous: Thinking-of-the-Other, translated by Michael B. Smith and Barbara Harshav (New York: Columbia University Press: 1998), 79-80.