Levinasian Meditations: Ethics, Philosophy, and Religion

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Richard A. Cohen, Levinasian Meditations: Ethics, Philosophy, and Religion, Duquesne University Press, 2010, 380pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780820704333.

Reviewed by Martin Kavka, Florida State University


This volume collects seventeen of Cohen's essays published during the last twelve years on the French Jewish phenomenologist Emmanuel Levinas. The essays are divided into two sections. The first section, "Ethics as First Philosophy," covers thematic material similar to that in Cohen's 2001 book Ethics, Exegesis and Philosophy: the critical stance that Levinas takes toward other figures in the phenomenological and philosophical traditions. (This section also contains a wonderful little essay on Levinas's frequent, and frequently ignored, citations to Shakespeare.) The second section, "A Religion for Adults," contains essays on the place of Judaism, and the relationship between Judaism and philosophy, in Levinas's writings. Yet this latter section is not an inessential appendage to the first; rather, it is its sequel. Levinasian Meditations, in its structure, embodies a claim frequently found in scholarship on Levinas, namely that Judaism and its other-centered ethics, through its countercultural stance, can play a role in saving the modern West from the historical evils that have resulted from the West's tendency either to create social commonalities through political violence or to erase social difference through genocide and ethnic cleansing. Those who read these essays seriatim will quickly infer that many of them are, at least in part, responses to unnamed others who have offered dismissive responses either to Cohen's approach to Levinas or to Levinas's philosophy tout court. It strikes me as very possible that readers of Levinasian Meditations will misinterpret it as a result.

In commenting on Levinas's well-known notion that first philosophy is responsibility to the other person -- that value is more fundamental than fact -- Cohen writes in the introduction to the first section:

Clearly from such a perspective certain commonplaces of academic life will be called into question, indeed challenged and overturned. For instance, consider the superior snobbery which looks down on ethics as a kind of narrow-mindedness of "preaching," the sneering dismissive use of the term "moralist" whenever ethical issues are taken seriously, i.e., when they demand a response and not merely an intellectualization. (9)

From the sequence of these sentences, it is likely that that the snobbery that Cohen mentions has taken place within the "commonplaces of academic life." Some Ph.D.-bearing individual or group has dismissed Cohen's work as mere preaching, not "real" philosophy. Cohen returns the name-calling with the charge of elitism. While this might serve for some as a perverse form of entertainment, such a response is dangerous, for it reduces philosophizing to the kind of faceless discourse frequently found online -- even in some well-known philosophy blogs! -- in which the style of an assertion is more important than its content. (Insults are more effective when they are given flesh; see Venus Xtravaganza's lesson on "reading" in Jennie Livingston's 1991 documentary Paris Is Burning.)

Cohen's response to his interlocutor(s) acquires its full force when he brings up the charge of preaching again near the opening of his 2006 essay "Levinas, Plato, and Ethical Exegesis." On this occasion, Cohen more than adequately defeats the charge. Following Martha Nussbaum's analysis of the Symposium in her The Fragility of Goodness, Cohen asserts that the life of thinking sacrifices a worthy Alcibiadean appreciation of sensible beauty, while the life of eros sacrifices Diotima's worthy recommendation of intellectual contemplation. But if Nussbaum's essay on the Symposium ends on a note of tragedy, with eros and philosophy unable to coexist in harmony with one another, Cohen converts this into a tune of redemption (101): "Does not the dialogue itself represent the form of philosophy that remains embodied, remains a literature, while loving wisdom, loving knowledge?" Knowledge can only be loved when a dialogue partner is loved; there is no intellectual life without the moral life. Levinas described his first magnum opus, Totality and Infinity (1961), as a "return to Platonism" and there interpreted the Phaedrus as offering an account of discourse as "not the unfolding of a prefabricated internal logic, but the constitution of truth in a struggle between thinkers … discourse is thus the experience of something absolutely foreign." Indeed, a phenomenology of discourse had grounded Levinas's thought of transcendence and alterity a decade earlier, in the 1951 essay "Is Ontology Fundamental?", which bases its argument on the simple point that in speaking to someone else, I neglect "the universal being that he incarnates in order to remain with the particular being he is."[1]

At this point, Cohen's claim for ethics is no longer one that rests on an attitude that others could take as neither natural nor phenomenological, but simply hoity-toity. Nor does it rest on the circularity of citing Levinas as an authority in order to "prove" that Levinas is correct, as the secondary work on Levinas sometimes does. Rather, Levinas's arguments place the burden on the "snob" to show that objects in the world come pre-laden with noninferentially acquired conceptual content. To argue against Levinasian "moralism" is also to argue against the Sellarsian claim that logical space is not "prior to, or independent of, the acquisition of a language." This is not a point that Cohen explicitly makes. Nevertheless, I suspect that his collegial encounters might run more smoothly if it were. As it stands, too often the essays in the first section of this book claim philosophical strength for Levinas only by claiming the moral weakness of the consequences of other person's philosophical stances, whether Derrida, Sartre, Buber, Heidegger, or Kant. Yet to state that Kant is supersessionist or that Heidegger is ateleological (chapter 1), or that Heidegger is an aesthete (chapter 2) and an egotist (chapter 3), or that Buber, Sartre and Derrida remain too strongly in the thrall of Heidegger (chapters 4, 7, 9) is not quite to say that Levinas is correct. Even if Cohen's readings of these figures are persuasive and careful (as is especially the case in the essay on Levinas and Sartre), it is primarily in the essays on Plato and on the opening sentences of Totality and Infinity (chapter 6) that the reader understands how Levinas might not be simply better than these other thinkers, but might also (not "rather"!) be saying something truer.

Even if Cohen were to have associated Levinas with other representatives of nonfoundationalism, the point of view of Levinasian Meditations might still run into problems. For in these essays, especially in the second section of the book, Cohen correlates the value of Levinas with the value of Judaism. Yet if Levinas is a thinker who privileges pragmatics over semantics, on what ground could Cohen write about God's "concrete personal benevolence" (220)? Why would it be important for Levinas to write that "we must return to Jewish wisdom," or for Cohen to endorse this claim (229), if we could simply find the primacy of ethics through analyzing the structure of conversation? These questions -- wondering how one defends Judaism as a set of propositional truths ("God is benevolent," or "God is the source of wisdom," or "God commands the performance of some act X") -- become most baffling for me when I read Cohen's defense of male circumcision (chapter 15), which is valuable because "Judaism teaches the unity of spiritual meaning and physical act" (290). Again, this claim may be true. But why would spiritual meaning have to be accomplished in this particular physical act, especially if there are other physical acts (e.g. eating according to the laws of kashrut) that perform the same act of valuing? Why circumcise men and not women? Why circumcise newborns and not adults? The criterion here for circumcision's value is simply too diffuse; some knowledgeable readers will read Cohen's argument and find new power in the words of the Jewish reformer Abraham Geiger, who described circumcision in a famous 1845 letter to the historian Leopold Zunz as "a barbaric, gory rite which fills the infant's father with fear and subjects the new mother to harmful emotional strain."[2] (Geiger was almost a lone voice within Judaism on this issue.)

Cohen is correct to say that Levinas was anti-theological (chapter 16), meaning that Levinas opposed accounts of religion that centered on dogma. Both near the end of Levinas's second magnum opus, Otherwise than Being (1974), and in the 1951 essay cited above, Levinas placed "theology" and "religion" in contradistinction to each other. And yet to infer from this that Levinas posited some kind of religious path in which performing ethical acts led to a state of affairs in which "God is found" (313) -- much like Martin Buber, who wrote in I and Thou (1923) that "whoever goes forth to his You with his whole being and carries to it all the beings of the world finds him whom one cannot seek" -- is in my view to misunderstand Levinas. At one point (311f.), Cohen approvingly quotes the section of the 1951 essay in which Levinas distinguished between theology and religion. There is an important and unmarked ellipsis in Cohen's quote. The full quote appears below:

This tie to the other, which does not reduce itself to the representation of the Other but rather to his invocation, where invocation is not preceded by comprehension, we call religion. In choosing the term religion -- without having pronounced the word God or the word sacred -- we initially have in mind the meaning that Auguste Comte gives to this term in the beginning of his System of Positive Polity. Nothing theological, nothing mystical, lies hidden behind the analysis that we have just given of the encounter with the other (BPW, p. 8).

For Levinas, there was such a thing as religion that did not contain "God" as a meaningful word. While Cohen omits the positive reference to Comte (perhaps because Cohen himself associates Comte with a totalizing Hegel in the essay included as the first chapter of this volume), Levinas in this essay endorsed Comte's description of true religion as "morally excellent" in the preface to the System of Positive Polity. It also seems likely -- the absence of a footnote to Comte is frustrating to the contemporary scholar -- that Levinas would have also endorsed Comte's critique in the opening chapter of theology as too abstract to have any power to deal with "practical existence." Religion, for Levinas, is aptly described as a set of cultural practices through which a variety of ethical norms are inculcated. Yet Levinas must have (or should have) seen these norms as contestable; as Cohen himself acknowledges in quoting Levinas's comments on the Phaedrus, truth is constituted in a "struggle between thinkers." Who knows who will win this struggle?

Religious traditions, if they are to acknowledge the nonfoundationalism that is implicit in a phenomenology of discourse, must be broken and remade (and rebroken and remade, and … ). They must not be confused with things that have essences, and if Cohen sometimes implicitly acknowledges this -- for example, in several reminders that Levinas engaged in an "ethical exegesis" of the Jewish tradition -- on other occasions Cohen makes the un-Levinasian move of lionizing the past for its own sake. If Levinas's claims about religion are true, they can only be persuasive if scholars of Levinas hear what Levinas heard in Plato (and in the rabbis) and acknowledge that truth is exterior to various policy positions and traditional practices. Although such policies and practices are key in preventing religion from just becoming another form of abstraction, traditionalism is also at times just as powerless to deal with practical existence, e.g., the person in the community who asks for halakha to be justified. I fear that if scholars of Levinas do not do this, they will be dismissed as moralists.

[1] Levinas, Basic Philosophical Writings, p. 7.

[2] Max Wiener (ed.), Abraham Geiger & Liberal Judaism, p. 114.