Liars and Heaps: New Essays On Paradox

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Beall, J.C., ed., Liars and Heaps: New Essays On Paradox, Oxford University Press, 2003, 320PP, $29.95 (PBK), ISBN 0199264813.

Reviewed by Matti Eklund, University of Colorado


This is a collection of papers originally presented at a conference with the same name. As the name indicates, the papers deal with the liar and sorites paradoxes. The exceptions are two papers which deal with the possibility of absolutely unrestricted quantification. But this topic is closely connected with that of the paradoxes.

The collection is very good; arguably a must-read for everyone interested in the paradoxes. Contributors to the volume are Graham Priest, Achille Varzi, Stewart Shapiro, Rosanna Keefe, Crispin Wright, Richard Heck, Scott Soames, Michael Glanzberg, Delia Graff, Roy Sorensen, Keith Simmons, J.C. Beall, Hartry Field, Stephen Yablo, Agustín Rayo & Timothy Williamson, and Vann McGee. The second, fourth, etc. contributions are replies to the immediately preceding papers. Often, however, the replies are quite capable of standing on their own.

Priest defends a ’fuzzy’ solution to the sorites according to which semantic values themselves are fuzzy; Varzi in his reply raises some problems. Shapiro defends a contextualist solution to the sorites; Keefe raises problems in her reply. Wright defends his intuitionist “quandary” account of vagueness (here called the agnosticist account); Heck in his reply among other things suggests that standard objections to supervaluationism are far from as damning as they might seem. Soames discusses the problem of higher-order vagueness as it arises for the account of vagueness he has earlier defended. Glanzberg argues against the existence of truth-value gaps by appeal to Dummettian ideas about truth. In her rich discussion, Graff among other things seeks to emphasize the seriousness of the problem that higher-order vagueness presents for the supervaluationist. Sorensen discusses a number of versions of what he calls the “no-no” paradox – the paradox in the liar family where two utterances express the non-truth of each other – that involve assertions about lack of determinate truth. Simmons applies his contextualist solution to the liar paradox to paradoxes of denotation; Beall presents a dilemma for Simmons. Field defends a combined solution to the liar and sorites paradoxes; Yablo brings up problems for Field’s account as it applies to the liar. Rayo and Williamson prove a completeness theorem for first-order languages where the quantifiers range over absolutely everything; McGee in his reply seeks to bring out the philosophical significance of Rayo and Williamson’s result.

The contributors to the volume represent a sizable subset of the important theorists in the field. Moreover, they do not simply rehash old ideas; the essays constitute genuine advancements. In light of the contributors’ prominence in the field, the present volume has a good claim to represent the state of the art (even though the book does not purport to cover all bases), and an overview of the book provides a significant glimpse of what the field looks like. Here are some noteworthy features.

First, contextualism. In the 1997 anthology on vagueness edited by Keefe and Smith, contextualism about vagueness and the sorites is barely mentioned, and I do not think this was, at the time, bad editorial judgment. Now, however, I think omitting contextualism would be a bad mistake. Contextualism as a solution to the sorites paradox is defended by Shapiro, Soames and Glanzberg. It is prominently, if critically, discussed in Keefe’s reply to Shapiro and in the papers by Priest and Heck. (Contextualism about the liar and related paradoxes is also defended in Simmons’ contribution. With respect to that problem, however, contextualism is far from a novelty.)

Second, Shapiro and Heck independently characterize vagueness in terms of (what Heck calls) quasi-tolerance. To explain quasi-tolerance, let me begin by explaining the notion of tolerance. A predicate F is tolerant iff there is some difference in the predicate’s parameter of application so small that a difference that small can never make a difference with respect to the justice with which the predicate is applied. Vague predicates appear to us to be tolerant. But they cannot actually be tolerant, as shown by the sorites paradox. The quasi-tolerance of a predicate F consists in the fact that there is some difference in the predicate’s parameter of application so small that if a and a’ differ by that little, along the relevant dimension, then one can never know or competently judge a to be F but a’ not to be F. The claim by Shapiro and Heck is that vagueness is quasi-tolerance. (There are niceties concerning formulation, but this should bring across the general idea. There are potential counterexamples to the general idea to worry about. In unpublished work, Brian Weatherson brings up examples like “is in his early thirties” and “is a small integer” as vague predicates which do not intuitively appear tolerant.) To the best of my knowledge this hypothesis about the nature of vagueness was first defended in print by Patrick Greenough in a 2003 article in Mind; already two other theorists have defended the idea. It appears to be a trend.

Third, a standard objection to supervaluationism and to approaches to vagueness that involve adopting a many-valued or fuzzy logic is that even the supervaluationist or the deviant logician is forced to countenance sharp cutoffs somewhere: she merely replaces the bipartite classification of the classical, bivalent approach with a similarly problematic n-partite classification for some finite n>2 (in the fuzzy case, the distinctions are between the perfectly true, the perfectly false, and what is in between) – and since these new cutoffs are as problematic as the one cutoff between the true and false, nothing has been gained. One common reply to this problem is to advert to a vague metalanguage. In this volume, Priest and Field make this move. A more original type of reply is here defended, in two very different ways, by Scott Soames and Richard Heck. Soames and Heck both positively embrace the conclusion that there is a sharp n-partite classification, for some finite n>2, and seek to explain why this should be more attractive than a sharp bipartite classification. Soames argues that the distinction between truth and falsity is so important to ordinary speakers that we should expect the judgments of ordinary speakers in possession of all extralinguistic facts to approximate well the actual facts about truth and falsity; but not so with speakers’ grasp of what is determinately true. (The upshot is that Soames defends a five-partite classification.) What Heck stresses is that whatever exactly it is that determines reference is likely to fail to decide all cases: it is plausible to suppose that there will be a range of cases that are undecided. Hence it is already on independent grounds – forget vagueness – plausible to think that predicates will effect tripartite classifications. (There is an obvious, whether in the end compelling, objection that Heck does not consider. It is that whatever implausibility attaches to the suggestion that whatever determines reference, call it X, generally should give rise to bivalent classifications also attaches to the suggestion that it should be determinate what is and is not determined by X.)

All the general features I have brought up concern vagueness. This is not an accident. Although the book deals with both the sorites and the liar, it is somewhat slanted toward the sorites. Eight of the papers are on vagueness; five are on liar-related paradoxes. Moreover, more of the vagueness papers aim to give positive contributions. Although Beall’s and Yablo’s replies to Simmons and Field, respectively, are very good, they are precisely only replies.

So far I have focused on themes that recur throughout the book. Now on to general features of the texts in the collection. One thing that particularly strikes me is the relative lack of meta-considerations, of serious reflection on what investigation into the problems discussed is good for, and of what the goals of the inquiries are. The literature on the sorites and liar paradoxes can easily come off as something of a cottage industry: an area of philosophy where fairly much work is being done, but such that its significance for anything else is less than obvious. The essays in the present collection do little to change this impression. It would be grossly unfair to say that the essays are insulated from the rest of the philosophical literature. Many of the contributors are, needless to say, justly well-known for important contributions to philosophy of language. And ideas from other parts of the literature are made use of. For example, the contributors writing on context make frequent reference to the work by David Lewis and Robert Stalnaker on context. But, and this is my point, a reader coming new to the literature on paradoxes may be excused for wondering, after having read this book, what significance for anything else the work on paradoxes might have. (I certainly do not mean to imply by these remarks that the paradoxes do lack such significance.)

Here is another point about the lack of meta-considerations. Some theorists have claimed, both with respect to the sorites paradox and with respect to the liar paradox, that a solution of the kind apparently normally sought cannot be had. Tarski said, (in)famously, that the liar paradox arises because our language is inconsistent. Michael Dummett has argued that the use of vague (or essentially vague) predicates is “intrinsically inconsistent” and that there can be no “coherent logic” of vague expressions”. More recently, Stephen Schiffer has argued that few, if any, genuine philosophical paradoxes have “happy-face solutions”, where a happy-face solution involves identifying the odd-guy-out and showing why this “now-undisguised-masquerader” seemed so plausible in the first place, doing so in such a way that the misleading impression is explained away. He prominently discusses the sorites paradox as one paradox that lacks a happy-face solution. Whether or not this type of skepticism is in the end justified, there appears to be a good question of what warrants the belief that the paradoxes have the kinds of solutions normally sought. But questions like this are absent from the papers in the present volume.

On now to a different but related issue. Michael Glanzberg’s contribution to the volume is an extended argument against truth-value gaps. The argument Glanzberg gives owes much to Dummett. The basic idea is that truth is the constitutive aim of assertion. This “gives us a standard that any account of truth values must meet: it must show how the truth values can be understood as evaluations of assertions for success or failure in achieving their intrinsic purpose” (165). We can correctly say that there are truth-value gaps only if this claim meets that standard. Glanzberg calls this the Dummettian challenge (165). He goes on to present a “prima facie case” against truth-value gaps based on this conception of the issue. The prima facie case departs from the idea that a speech act can only either meet its purpose or fail to meet its purpose: this appears to rule out gaps. Having presented this prima facie case, Glanzberg goes on to discuss the kinds of cases that friends of truth-value gaps appeal to when attempting to make their case, like that of sentences involving partially defined predicates (Glanzberg’s paper is a reply to that of Soames – and Soames often uses such examples). He argues that the examples fail.

I want to pause on an interesting, and potentially problematic, feature of the structure of the argument. For Glanzberg, truth is a theoretical concept for use in accounts of language, expressing the property which is the aim of assertion (that is, the property such that assertions are characterized by the fact that they are utterances whose norm of correctness is satisfied just in case they have this property) and argues against truth-value gaps on this basis. It is easy to imagine at least two other sorts of discussions of the existence of truth-value gaps. One takes truth as a theoretical concept in metaphysics, expressing something like correspondence with the facts, and investigates if, given this conception of truth, there is room for truth-value gaps. Yet another type of discussion shies away from consideration of the deep theoretical purposes of a notion of truth and proceeds by way of consultation of our intuitions about the application of our ordinary predicates of truth and falsity. Naturally someone like Glanzberg might argue that the ordinary concept of truth is the same concept as, or at least necessarily coextensive with, the concept of truth conceived as expressing the property which is the aim of assertion. But Glanzberg gives no such argument, and the argument would not be trivial.

Once these three distinct projects are laid out side by side, a kind of pluralism should suggest itself as an alternative: maybe the correct thing to say is that given some way of conceiving of truth there are truth-value gaps and given some other way of conceiving of truth there are not – and no way is better than the other. I am not presenting this pluralism in order to defend it. Maybe one way of conceiving of truth is better or more fundamental than the others. Or maybe we should regard truth-value gaps the same way on either of these views on truth. But what is striking about the literature on the paradoxes – including the contributions to the present collection – is that virtually no attention is paid to the issue of how best to conceive of questions of the nature of truth. Theorists discuss the question of whether there are truth-value gaps as if this obviously was a question with a clear meaning, or at least a unique answer. Glanzberg, of course, does pay considerable attention to what the question of whether there are truth-value gaps comes to. But he too takes for granted that there is just one issue here.

Questions similar to those about the issue of whether there can be truth-value gaps can be asked about the issue of whether there can be degrees of truth. How should we understand this question? Is it about whether there can be degrees to which assertions meet their aim? Or about whether there are degrees to which propositions correspond to reality? Or about whether it accords with ordinary speaker intuitions about the predicate ’true’ that truth might come in degrees?

In a 1985 review article on work on the liar paradox, Geoffrey Hellman wrote, “Just what problem is addressed, and what is to count as a ’solution’?”, suggesting that the work he reviews fails to address this question. What I have wanted to show through my discussion of the absence of meta-considerations is that the question seems as apt now, and is as apt in the case of the sorites as in the case of the liar.