Liberal Loyalty: Freedom, Obligation, and the State

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Anna Stilz, Liberal Loyalty: Freedom, Obligation, and the State, Princeton UP, 2009, 230pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691139142.

Reviewed by Lea Ypi, Nuffield College, Oxford



Consider a representative democratic citizen living in a reasonably just state: Sally from Toronto. Sally’s relationship to the Canadian state and to her fellow Canadian citizens is defined by a set of political obligations that promote but also limit the opportunities available in pursuing her life plans. Our commonsense intuitions about these political obligations tell us that Sally has, among others, a duty to obey Canadian laws, to pay taxes, to vote and participate in Canadian political life, to show concern for the well-being of her compatriots, and so on. They also tell us that while Sally is responsible for failing to comply with the political obligations she owes to her fellow-Canadian citizens, we should not expect her to perform the same duties towards the members of other, perhaps equally just, states. If Sally has a prima facie duty to, say, pay the taxes imposed by Canadian law and contribute to the well-being of her compatriots, it would be unreasonable to require her to contribute in equal measure when the interests of other citizens, for example, citizens of the United States, are at stake. Are these intuitions justified? And if so, why?

Anna Stilz’s excellent first book, Liberal Loyalty: Freedom, Obligation and the State, introduces Sally’s example in order to illustrate the two main challenges that any theory of “liberal” loyalty and political obligation is bound to face. The first is to justify the normative standing of the state, to explain the grounds for the political obligations we attribute to citizens of democratic states, and to do so by relying on purely liberal values, such as the freedom and equality of all human beings. The second is to account for what she calls, following A. J. Simmons, the particularity assumption. This assumption challenges the idea that liberal citizens are bound by obligations to support any state that instantiates the values of freedom and equality, including the state that does so in the best possible way. It requires citizens to only support the institutions of their particular state. But are these two requirements consistent with each other? Cosmopolitans think that they are not. If our loyalty to the state is grounded on a universal moral obligation to respect the freedom and equality of all human beings, then it seems arbitrary to restrict the scope of these obligations to the territorial boundaries within which individuals happen to interact. If Sally cares about freedom and equality, why can’t she decide to commit politically to either an institution which best promotes those values or to a set of people where her contribution might actually be more needed?

Cosmopolitans are not the only ones to believe that vindicating both universal moral values and the particularity assumption is hopeless. For once they agree with nationalists. It may well be true, nationalists claim, that universal values are unable to explain the special relevance of compatriot obligations. But universal values are not all there is. If we want to understand why I have a duty to comply with these particular laws and not others, and to be held politically accountable by this particular set of people and not others, we ought to focus on the special nature of “associative” obligations. Far from being voluntarily acquired by individual citizens, these associative obligations are grounded on the specific relevance of a certain kind of associative bond, determined by membership in the cultural nation. Sally’s greater commitment to the laws and people of Canada, as opposed to those of the United States, is due to her sharing with Canadians something that she doesn’t share with the citizens of the United States: territory, social practices, history and the sense of belonging to a distinct cultural entity.

Stilz is critical of both these perspectives. She is critical of cosmopolitans because they assimilate political obligations to clear-cut moral duties that all individuals know and can act upon prior to joining any kind of political association. And she is critical of nationalists because they ground political obligations on contingent, perceived beliefs about cultural commonalities rather than on an impartial justification of the value of political associations. She examines both of these issues from a distinct perspective, inspired by Kant’s and Rousseau’s theories of political authority and civic obligation, which explains the unique relevance of the state in guaranteeing the freedom and equality of all human beings. In doing so, she rescues Kant from the hands of cosmopolitans and Rousseau from the hands of nationalists. On her reading, the state need not be a mere instrument for the realization of people’s pre-political rights, and it also need not be an association to which they explicitly consent prior to endorsing the political obligations its institutions prescribe. The state, so the argument goes, is a unique and necessary public institution required to define and specify what “rights” actually are, compatibly with principles of equal freedom. Moreover, once the normative relevance of the state is justified from a normative perspective, citizens’ collective participation in shared democratic practices gives them sufficient reason to support particular political institutions without needing to invoke nationality-based features.

The current cosmopolitan interpretation of Kant’s political theory tends to place exclusive emphasis on Kant’s principles of ethics and the universal formula of humanity thereby neglecting both Kant’s Doctrine of Right and its systematic arguments in favour of the state. One of the greatest merits of Stilz’s book is that, whilst avoiding most of the exegetical controversies that the Kantian distinction between right and ethics has generated, it shifts focus from the more familiar aspects of Kant’s theory, in particular the justification of a cosmopolitan international federation, in order to direct attention to the systematically more interesting discussion of “public right” and the related analysis of the state. Of course, the effort is not entirely unprecedented in the Kantian literature and Stilz’s book does not engage with the kind of fine-grained textual interpretation that would bring out some limits in her attempt to place Kant squarely within the liberal tradition (for example, as regards his position towards autocratic regimes, his rejection of what we might now call “humanitarian intervention”, or his denial of a right to revolution).

But this is not necessarily a fault, so long as one is clear about what the book is trying to achieve. Stilz defends the idea that the state is a necessary and unique institution for realizing people’s innate right to freedom, and it does so by contrasting Kant’s theory to Lockean-inspired, consent-based accounts of political authority (e.g., the one developed by A. J. Simmons). As an attempt to illustrate the merits of an alternative approach to political obligation there is a lot to be learned and further developed from here. Although, as Stilz shows, both types of theories articulate the justification of the state through an analysis of individuals’ right to “freedom as independence”, what makes the Kantian defence of the state compelling is that it need not be understood as a voluntary association to which people consent in order to have their property rights implemented. On the contrary, people’s pre-political claims to external things are always subject to conflicting interpretations. Moreover, since rights place agents under coercively enforceable obligations, any unilateral attempt to use force in order to allocate these obligations would encounter others’ legitimate resistance. The state is justified because it is a unique and necessary instrument through which citizens’ indeterminate right to “freedom as independence” can be defined and impartially adjudicated.

This Kantian justification of the state is supplemented in Stilz’s account by a Rousseauian-inspired analysis of the constraints under which states must be placed for their authority to be considered legitimate. Contrary to Kant’s suggestion that once a collective political authority is established, it is neither possible nor desirable for individuals to scrutinize its origin or rebel against it, Stilz argues, along Rousseauian lines, that only democratic states expressing the citizens’ “general will” command citizens’ political obligations. Taking seriously the innate right to freedom requires constructing institutions that protect individuals from arbitrary domination, and this is only possible if all citizens bracket their private, partial interests and subject themselves to political institutions that could be rationally justified by all.

This “non-domination” account of political obligation is further deployed to clarify how, when applied to issues of global justice, the Kantian-Rousseauian position does not lead to an endorsement of the kind of strong statism (à la Thomas Nagel) which would deny that principles of justice apply to relations between non-citizens. Instead, Stilz advocates the necessity to create a global political authority responsible for regulating relations between states but without endorsing the view that the content of our distributive obligations to fellow-citizens is therefore identical to that of our obligations to foreigners.

In short, the extension of the Kantian-Rousseauian position to issues of global justice speaks against global egalitarianism and in favour of liberal internationalism. But I have some doubts here. Stilz seems to take seriously the “provisional” nature of Kant’s theory of domestic right and the idea of its interdependence from international and cosmopolitan right. But if one grants as much, it is hard to rule out global equality of distributive shares. Of course, egalitarianism is not, strictly speaking, a component of Kant’s own conception of global justice. But doubts have been raised even about whether it is a component of Kant’s conception of domestic justice and Stilz’s project is, in any case, “Kantian” rather than Kant’s own. The problem is that if one takes seriously, as Stilz does, the spirit of Kant’s “permissive” principle of practical reason (Erlaubnisgesetz) and the idea that any domestic distribution of rights and obligations becomes conclusive only in the presence of a universal association of states, it seems hard to avoid the thought that even a domestic system of rights might be provisional unless a global authority has assigned each state its own. In any case, saying that because justice requires states in order to be realized, whatever system of global justice we defend will have to be compatible with their continued existence, and with the ongoing special relationship between fellow-citizens is a kind of statement that requires much more argument to be made persuasive (p. 106). For it is one thing to say that state-based membership is the source of fundamental political obligations and another one to defend whatever domestic system of rights citizens of a particular state have jointly established. The point here is not that if we take seriously Kant’s “provisionality” argument, global egalitarian principles will end up being necessarily justified. The point is rather that they cannot be ruled out. If we take seriously the provisional status of domestic right, the claims and obligations of individuals both within the state and across states cannot be unilaterally established.

Now the Kantian and Rousseauian arguments in defence of the normative standing of the state respond to only half of the initial challenge. Justifying the state on the basis of the idea that it is a necessary institution through which individuals’ innate right to freedom takes determinate shape only explains why citizens in general have political obligations, not why these obligations bind them to particular states. The second part of Stilz’s book is dedicated to providing an account of democratic solidarity which, in contrast to nationalist accounts, does not rely on pre-established cultural features to justify allegiance to particular states. She does so by providing what she calls “the freedom model”, an account of political education inspired by Rousseau’s Émile and focused on the importance of “reflective” rather than “emotional” identification to explain the relationship between individuals and fellow-citizens. Contrary to some of the existing literature, the Rousseauian notion of amour-propre (self-regard) is here treated as a positive passion which, placed in the right institutional framework, can help to cultivate human beings’ capacity for cognitively-based rather than emotionally-driven identification with others. Amour-propre is the moral sentiment that prompts individuals to be concerned with their relative status in society, yet the way it concretely develops depends on the social relations in which individuals find themselves. More particularly, in the context of institutions promoting social equality, individuals’ amour-propre, far from nurturing their egoistic contest for power, directs their attention to the communal aspects of life in common and develops a sense of social solidarity. In other words, knowledge becomes here an important basis for social affection. Collective identification and the reflective attitude with which individuals assess the works of social institutions is sufficient to explain the development of communal bonds of solidarity.

One might object here that since the basis for social identification is in any case cognitively supported, rather than emotionally driven, this might make it hard to explain why individuals then identify with particular social institutions rather than with any just set that guarantees the conditions for the development of freedom and equality. The last two chapters of Stilz’s book address precisely this challenge. Drawing on a particular interpretation of Habermas’s constitutional patriotism, which directs attention to the relationship between fundamental moral constraints and positive laws, Stilz clarifies that the particular democratic practice through which a citizen body historically comes to form, develop and revise a particular interpretation of these fundamental moral norms is not indifferent to the particular political processes and historically contingent features of the citizenry. Hence, the kinds of rights and obligations that a specific group sharing thin forms of political socialization comes to elaborate are unique and distinct from that of others. Stilz however complements the Habermasian defence of constitutional patriotism with an interesting and novel view of the way in which citizens can form an attachment to particular political institutions without relying on the pre-reflective features typical of nationalist and cultural models. She does so by developing a functional alternative to nationalist models, which explains allegiance to particular states by relying merely on the shared intentions of members participating in collective democratic practices.

This is one of the most interesting contributions of Stilz’s book. Drawing on recent studies in the philosophy of action and distinguishing between various accounts of collective cooperation, she defends a model of “shared intentions” in order to explain citizens’ unique political allegiance to collective democratic practices. Participants in a collective activity intend to perform an action together, and this collectively held intention of promoting a certain goal is sufficient to account for the special relations existing between these participants and no one else. The dynamics of emergence of a political collective body is here similar to that of a collective cooperative institution (e.g., an orchestra) characterized by members’ joint commitment to a certain kind of activity (e.g., playing music). In the orchestra case, the members’ interest in playing music gives them both prudential and non-prudential reason to be bound by special obligations of loyalty to other members of that shared activity. Participation in those activities changes the nature of relationships between those who take part in it and all others. The universal value of, in this case, playing music is what gives its members reasons of allegiance to their particular orchestra group. In a similar vein, the universal value of freedom and equality, and the shared democratic practice of creating and sustaining the institutions that attempt to realize these values, give members of particular political groups special obligations of loyalty.

It is possible to object to this analogy that whilst in the orchestra case, members acquire special obligations of loyalty after choosing to join a similar shared activity, in the case of the state, the point of the particularity challenge is that it applies to individuals who do not choose to be members of any given sufficiently just state. Stilz however insists that we might have special obligations of cooperation even in the case of a group formed not through voluntary participation but out of urgent necessity. Such is the case of a randomly formed group of potential fire-rescuers who would do wrong to refuse their help to others on grounds that they did not choose to be part of that randomly formed collective. But there are reasons to doubt that this example contributes to the kind of argument that Stilz would want it to support. True, where members’ active involvement would make a significant difference to the transformation of deeply unjust domestic political institutions, it might be wrong for citizens to refuse to help their fellow-citizens overcome existing states of affairs. But the particularity assumption, remember, is not really discussing those kinds of cases; rather, we are talking about sufficiently just states, and whether those who are involuntarily subject to their laws ought to have reason to support those laws, rather than others, perhaps more just ones. If the “shared intentions” argument explains the emergence of particular allegiances on grounds that they realize universal values in which all members believe, how can it prevent those members from committing to other particular institutions in which those values are better realized?

Stilz, to be sure, does not deny that citizens of particular states might have a right to emigrate, provided that they either renounce membership in the original state or prove a permanent connection to both states. However, it is hard to avoid the objection that the more we relax emigration constraints, the more we might end up undermining the explanation provided for why allegiance is owed to some particular institutions rather than others. For in this case, the Kantian-Rousseauian model starts to look dangerously similar to the kinds of consent-based alternatives it initially sought to avoid: the natural duty of justice becomes something that individuals are ultimately at freedom to decide how to discharge. Stilz’s qualification that such exercise ought to be consistent with the “regularly-affected” principle, i.e., that an individual is under a duty to create and uphold institutions jointly with the group of people whose rights are regularly affected by his acts is only partly satisfactory here. The sphere of application of the regularly-affected principle may only imperfectly coincide with that determined by particular state boundaries.

These concerns do not in the least detract from the merits of this book; they are simply intended to raise questions for further development. The Kantian-Rousseauian view of liberal loyalty is a very compelling one for those who want to avoid both the moral voluntarism of cosmopolitans and the potential political conservatism of their objectors. Stilz has articulated with great clarity and consistency an alternative to both consent-theories of political obligation and to their nationalist counterparts. That alternative will find many supporters, and deserves to be taken very seriously even by its critics.