Liberal Pluralism: The Implications of Value Pluralism for Political Theory and Practice

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Galston, William A., Liberal Pluralism: The Implications of Value Pluralism for Political Theory and Practice, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 150pp, $19.00 (pbk), ISBN 052101249X.

Reviewed by Leslie Green, York University


Liberal Pluralism is a brief book on three large topics: pluralism as a theory of value, liberalism as a theory of politics, and the relationship between the two. Clear, timely and suggestive, the argument attempted in such short compass is also inevitably incomplete and at points sketchy.

By value pluralism Galston intends the view that not all values are commensurable: they may neither be reduced to a single over-arching value nor completely rank-ordered. (Value pluralism is adopted and explained but not actually defended here.) By liberalism, he means a political theory valuing social diversity and tolerance, in contrast to the traditional view that liberalism is about liberty: “Properly understood, liberalism is about the protection of legitimate diversity.”(23) Galston argues that the relation between these ideals is one of mutual support: a liberal order is the one most likely to encourage the flourishing of different, valuable ways of life, and value pluralism supports tolerance-based liberalism (and undermines liberty-based liberalism). Indeed, at points Galston inclines to an even stronger view: “I suggest that liberalism derives much of its power from its consistency with … value pluralism.”(4)

Among the philosophical issues Galston treats are the relationship between liberalism and tolerance; the sources and limits of legitimate diversity; the defense (against John Rawls) of a “comprehensive” form of liberalism; and the defense (against John Gray) of liberalism’s compatibility with pluralism. On the institutional side, he probes the limits of democracy as a decision procedure; the scope of parents’ power over their children’s lives; the appropriate constitutional framework for a liberal pluralist state; and its capacity to secure social unity and social justice. He discusses some legal examples along the way, mostly American and lightly sketched.

While the book sustains interest throughout, Chapter 5 is especially useful in testing Gray’s argument, against Isaiah Berlin, that value pluralism undercuts liberalism. Gray says that by showing negative liberty to be but one incommensurable good among others, pluralism entails that illiberal societies are not necessarily inferior to liberal ones. Galston rightly replies that the core of Berlin’s ideal is not negative liberty as such, but in fact only a subspecies of it—it is pre-eminently the freedom from imprisonment, including the prison of ways of life that one cannot accept. If diversity is not merely an aesthetic ideal, then its importance surely lies here: it allows people to fit their lives to their own characters, needs and aspirations. Thus while people may if they wish choose for themselves pinched, constricted, deluded, unfree lives, they may not conscript others to join them. Value pluralism thus offers anti-liberals a “defensive” justification for the permissibility of choosing such lives for themselves, but it provides no “offensive” justification for dragging others along too, or for locking in those who once joined freely but who have now lost the faith. (54-58) While there is therefore no requirement that associational groups respect all familiar liberal rights as a matter of their internal constitutions, they must secure the effective, and not merely formal, right of their members to exit. (122-23)

This is an important argument, and it is at the core of Galston’s liberalism. No pluralist can also be a liberal without insisting on limits to permissible diversity. In addition to (and overlapping with) the “no imprisonment” requirement, Galston argues that the pluralist state may properly act to reduce coordination problems and conflict among legitimate diverse activities, to prevent and punish violations of individual rights, to resist illegitimate ways of life, and to support the cultural and political conditions necessary to sustain a liberal pluralist regime. Thus, in an example he mentions several times, liberal pluralists need not tolerate a religion that practices human sacrifice: “no free exercise for Aztecs.”(23) This is correct, but it is also too easy, for no liberal political theory (nor any humanistic theory) is going to tolerate ritual murder. The interest in—and challenge for—diversity-based liberalism lies entirely in the more complex cases.

Throughout his balanced and moderate discussion of such cases, Galston invokes the liberal ideal of people leading their own lives: “a liberal pluralist state insists on the importance of allowing human beings to live their lives in ways congruent with their varying conceptions of what gives life meaning and purpose.”(121) In application, however, he stretches that notion to include some people’s leading other people’s lives for them. For instance, he thinks ritual infant circumcision is an unproblematic example of a permissible religious variation protected by expressive liberty. (29) Yet one does not have to be very liberal to see a morally relevant difference between deciding to amputate parts of one’s own genitals, and deciding to amputate those of another person—or between deciding to drop out of school and deciding to remove another person from school, or (to take an example he does not discuss) between thinking that abstinence is the only acceptable form of birth control, and thinking that others should be deprived of information about or access to other forms. At these points, one is tempted to put to Galston the question he puts to Gray: “Why should B agree to serve simply as a means to A’s well-being? Nor, consistent with value pluralism, can dominant group A invoke paternalistic claims in favour of coercion….”(57) At the very least, in such cases in which diversity really is on the line, more detailed argument will be needed to establish that the practices do not breach the non-imprisonment restraint and do not violate fundamental rights to bodily and psychological integrity.

There is no need for Galston to apologize for “a certain loose-jointedness in the political inferences I draw from value pluralism” (92)—political theory is, he rightly insists, a matter of judgment and analogy, evidence and presumption—not definition and deduction. (This non-dogmatic cast is a most pleasant feature of the book, and his wise comments on method in political theory a bonus.) However, even loose relations must actually connect the relata. Here, they do not always do so. For example, Galston argues, “As a logical matter, the broad implication of value pluralism is clear. If there are no overriding values, then democracy cannot be such a value.”(81) But that is not even loosely implied by his account of pluralism. Galston’s pluralism is the idea that not all values are commensurable (or rankable); it is not the idea that none are. Pluralism is therefore compatible with broad areas of commensurability, and these commensurables may be the very values most relevant to assessing political institutions. Moreover, even in the face of widespread in commensurability, it is still perfectly consistent with pluralism that some political arrangements simply dominate others: they are better with respect to some of these incommensurable values and worse with respect to none. Neither alternative is excluded by Galston’s argument. He is surely right that the authority of democratic procedures is limited—all liberals insist on that—but it is not the truth of pluralism that proves it.

Second, for a liberal pluralist value-pluralism should be, if not a necessary condition, then at least a weighty part of the case for tolerance. In reality, it does less work in some of these arguments than Galston supposes. For example, were it really true that, “On average, parents understand their children’s individual traits better than public authorities do…”(100), then that would secure the special authority of parents quite apart from any claim about the diversity of values—parents will simply get it right more often than the state. We do not need to invoke pluralism to explain why the state should not act on mistaken views about value; pluralism is about the diversity of sound values. In fact, here one would have supposed that pluralism often has implications opposite to those that Galston draws. Can any pluralist honestly believe that straight parents best understand the individual traits and needs of their gay children, or hearing parents the needs of their deaf children, or religious parents the needs of their skeptical children? (Symptomatically, the book’s index contains an entry for “parents—rights of” but no entry for “children—rights of.”)

One reason that it is hard to gauge how much work pluralism does in his argument is that Galston generally sets a low bar for tolerance: we tolerate a practice when we do not coercively prohibit it. But that conclusion—certainly at the level of a rebuttable presumption, which is all Galston argues for (69-77)—can be derived on most plausible theories of value. Even a utilitarian has good grounds for a presumption against extirpating sexist religions—J.S. Mill sketched just such an argument in advocating tolerance of Mormon polygamy. Moreover, narrow tolerance is not what diverse social groups actually demand: they want their practices not only permitted, but also protected, sustained and supported by other people. They want their religious practices, not merely free of penalty, but also not “burdened” in any way by the state. They want parochial schools not only to exist, but also to be funded by tax credits. They want not only religious instruction, but also teachers free from significant regulation. These are, in Galston’s terms, partly “offensive” claims—and they are the ones that give traditional liberals most pause.