Libertarian Accounts of Free Will

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Clarke, Randolph, Libertarian Accounts of Free Will, Oxford, 2003, 254pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 019515987X.

Reviewed by Erik Carlsson , Uppsala University


The purpose of Clarke’s book is to assess the conceptual adequacy of libertarian accounts of free will, i.e., accounts which assume that free will is incompatible with determinism. Clarke discusses libertarian views of three types; noncausal, event-causal, and agent-causal. All noncausal accounts are found inadequate, while the best event-causal accounts are adequate, assuming the truth of “merely narrow” incompatibilism, i.e., the view that moral responsibility is, unlike free will, compatible with determinism. Given “broad” incompatibilism, claiming that moral responsibility is also incompatible with determinism, only agent-causal accounts can, according to Clarke, be adequate. The adequacy of such accounts presupposes, however, that substance causation is possible. Clarke finds good, although not decisive, reasons to reject the possibility of such causation. He concludes that the possibility of free will is doubtful, given broad incompatibilism.

This book is an important contribution to the debate on free will. Clarke provides a careful and comprehensive assessment of a variety of libertarian accounts. He displays impressive command of the subject and argues with subtlety and ingenuity. As far as I can tell, he significantly advances the discussion about such central issues as the problem of active control and the possibility of agent causation.

I shall first summarize what I take to be Clarke’s most important arguments and conclusions, and then raise a few critical questions.

Noncausal libertarian accounts maintain that free actions can be uncaused, and lack internal causal structure. In Clarke’s view, such accounts thereby fail to give an adequate characterization of the active control required for free will. Such control is, he argues, a causal phenomenon. “An agent’s exercising active control … consists in her action’s being caused by her, or in her action’s being caused, in an appropriate way, by certain events involving her, such as her having certain reasons and a certain intention” (p. 19). Furthermore, noncausal accounts cannot explain how actions are performed for reasons. Such an explanation, Clarke maintains, also requires “a certain sort of causal connection between the having of reasons and the action” (p. 24).

On event-causal libertarian accounts, a free action is caused by events involving the agent, such as her having certain beliefs, desires, reasons, or intentions. Such accounts differ from event-causal compatibilist accounts primarily by requiring that the action is nondeterministically caused by these events. Clarke argues, first, that the absence of causal determination precludes neither that the agent exercises sufficient active control for her action to be fully rational, nor that there is an adequate rational explanation of what she does. He goes on to address the problem of “diminished control”. This is the worry that nondeterministic causation leaves the agent with less active control than she would have if her action was causally determined by the relevant events.

Some libertarians have tried to avoid this problem by locating the required element of indeterminism at an earlier stage in the causal process issuing in the action. On such a “deliberative” libertarian account, the action itself may be causally determined by its most immediate causes, provided that some earlier event in the process is undetermined. A “centered” libertarian account, in contrast, requires that the action itself be undetermined. Clarke finds deliberative accounts defective, since they do not leave room for the agent to “make a difference … to how things go …. in the performance of a directly free action itself” (p. 64; Clarke’s emphasis). That the difference-making must be located in the action itself is, Clarke maintains, a fundamental libertarian tenet.

Moreover, deliberative accounts are found not to improve on centered accounts with respect to the problem of diminished control. According to Clarke, a centered account can adequately deal with this problem. One aspect of the problem is formulated by the “ensurance argument”. According to this argument, an agent in a deterministic world exercises greater control over her actions than does her counterpart in an indeterministic world, since the former agent, unlike the latter, has the power to ensure that she will decide in accordance with her evaluative judgments. But such antecedent control over one’s decisions, Clarke argues, is not of the “direct active” variety relevant to free will. Direct active control over a decision is exercised in making that decision, and not in performing some earlier action, or undergoing some earlier change.

The “argument from luck” is another aspect of the problem of diminished control. If a decision is nondeterministically caused, this argument goes, it is a matter of luck that the agent makes it. She might have decided differently even if everything prior to the decision, including facts about herself, would have been exactly as it actually was. This element of luck is said to diminish the agent’s control over her decision. In response, Clarke argues that indeterminism constitutes control-diminishing luck only if it is located between the agent’s attempt to do something and the result, and not if it is located before the attempt.

The upshot is that an event-causal libertarian account provides as much positive active control as a compatibilist account, but no more. Whether this amount of control suffices for free will depends, Clarke argues, on whether we assume broad or merely narrow incompatibilism. If an account provides for the openness of alternatives, as well as for the positive active control required for moral responsibility, there are good reasons to conclude that it adequately characterizes free will. (This is so even if it does not provide for certain other things that we value in connection with free will.) Assuming merely narrow incompatibilism, an event-causal compatibilist account provides for the positive active control needed for responsibility. Since a libertarian event-causal account provides the same amount of positive active control, in addition to open alternatives, it is then an adequate account of free will.

However, the mere openness of alternatives, understood as the absence of a determining cause, cannot, Clarke maintains, make a difference as to whether an agent is morally responsible. Hence, if a compatibilist account cannot provide for the control required for responsibility, neither can an event-causal libertarian account. If we assume broad incompatibilism, therefore, event-causal accounts do not leave room for responsibility. Since free will implies the possibility of moral responsibility, such accounts cannot then adequately characterize free will.

Assuming broad incompatibilism, free will requires some “further positive powers to causally influence which of the alternative courses of events that are open will become actual” (p. 105). Clarke moves on to consider whether an agent-causal libertarian account can provide such positive active control. He argues, first, that no account postulating the agent as the sole cause of a free action is adequate. Like noncausal accounts, such pure agent-causal accounts fail to provide reason-explanations of actions. Instead, he suggests an “integrated” agent-causal account. On this account, a free action has a nondeterministic conjunctive cause, one conjunct of which is the agent herself, and the other is her having certain reasons, etc. Each conjunct is a necessary, but not (even in a nondeterministic sense) sufficient cause of the action. In Clarke’s view, postulating the agent as a necessary cause provides for the further active control, lacking on event-causal accounts. In a parallel way, postulating the agent’s having certain reasons as a necessary cause ensures that she acts for reasons, and that there is a reason-explanation of her action. As noted, Clarke denies that a pure agent-causal account can ensure this.

The adequacy of an integrated agent-causal account obviously presupposes that agent causation is possible. Clarke finds, however, fairly strong reasons to reject the possibility of such causation. The most serious difficulties concern causation by substances in general, rather than causation by agents in particular. First, there is a problem regarding the temporality of causation. “Effects are caused to occur at times, and it might be argued that this can be so only if their causes likewise occur at times—only, that is, if their causes are directly in time in the way in which events are but substances are not” (p. 201). It can be replied that if a substance causes an event, then it does so in virtue of having a certain property at a certain time. The temporality of causation is thus accommodated in an indirect way. Clarke maintains, however, that this “comes perilously close to acknowledging that it is the substance’s having the property at the time in question that is the cause” (p. 202). Second, there is a problem about probability. Undetermined event causes, Clarke observes, generally affect the objective probabilities of their effects. Thus, it is plausible to claim that “any cause must be of a category individuals of which can affect the probabilities of their effects before those effects occur…” (p. 203). Since substances are not dated entities, or occurrences, they do not seem to belong to such a category. A third problem concerns the uniformity of causation. Clarke rejects the possibility that only substances are causes. On any plausible view, he maintains, at least some causes are events. But if both events and substances can be causes, causation works in two quite different ways. “In a case of event causation, the causal power borne by a given property is exerted by an object’s having that property at a certain time. In a case of substance causation, the power carried by the property is exerted by the object” (p. 208). Such diversity of causation Clarke finds implausible.

The main conclusions of the book are thus as follows. If merely narrow incompatibilism is correct, a libertarian event-causal account can adequately characterize what is involved in free will. If broad incompatibilism is correct, only an integrated agent-causal account can be adequate. Since there are rather good reasons to reject the possibility of agent causation, it is doubtful whether free will is then possible.

On two central points, I find Clarke’s arguments unconvincing. My first doubt concerns his response to the problem of diminished control, and to the argument from luck in particular. Suppose you find yourself in a situation where you can save the life of an injured child, by calling an ambulance on your cell phone. You are aware of the relevant facts in the situation, and strongly motivated to save the child. Unbeknownst to you, however, someone has put an indeterministic device in your cell phone. If you try to use the phone, there is a 50 percent chance that the device will be activated and destroy it. Luckily, the device is not activated, the phone works, and the child is saved. Clearly, it was a matter of control-diminishing luck that you succeeded to save him. Given the presence of the device, you had little control over whether your attempt would be successful. You would not have been blameworthy if you had failed.

Now, consider a second version of the case. In this version, an indeterministic device has been implanted in your brain, instead of in your cell phone. If you try to make up your mind about what to do, there is a 50 percent chance that the device will be activated. If it is activated, it will cause you to decide contrary to your best reasons and evaluative judgments. In the present situation, it would cause you to decide not to call for an ambulance. Luckily, the device is not activated, you decide to make the call, and the child is saved. It seems to be just as much a matter of control-diminishing luck that you manage to save the child in this second case, as it was in the first. Given the presence of the device, you had little control over whether you would make the right decision. You would not have been blameworthy if you had decided wrongly.

Clarke would claim, however, that only the first case involves control-diminishing luck. By being located between the agent’s attempt and the result, the indeterminism in the first case “may decrease the likelihood of her succeeding at what she is trying to do. This fact provides an explanation for why indeterminism so located can constitute control-diminishing luck” (p. 80). This explanation, Clarke notes, “is not available when the indeterminism at issue is just the nondeterministic causation of an action by its immediate causal antecedents” (ibid.). Hence, he argues, indeterminism of the latter sort, such as that involved in the second version of my example, does not constitute control-diminishing luck.

This argument does not appear very strong. The explanation of there being control-diminishing luck may be different in different cases. The fact that a certain explanation is not available, in a particular case, does not show that such luck is not present. In my opinion, the clear intuition that my second example involves control-diminishing luck weighs more heavily than the unavailability, in this example, of Clarke’s suggested explanation. Besides, there is an explanation closely analogous to Clarke’s available in this case. The indeterminism involved decreases the likelihood that you will even attempt to do the right thing. This fact may explain why the indeterminism constitutes control-diminishing luck.

Clarke advances a further argument against the claim that there is control-diminishing luck in cases of indeterminism prior to the decision. The presence of control-diminishing luck, Clarke observes, is often taken to undermine the intentionality of the action. Hence, if indeterminism prior to the decision were to constitute such luck, this indeterminism would tend to undermine intentionality. But, Clarke maintains, this is not the case.

This argument, too, seems rather weak. Clarke assumes that since control-diminishing luck due to indeterminism after the action does undermine intentionality, so would control-diminishing luck due to indeterminism prior to the decision. This assumption is unwarranted. There is, arguably, a simple explanation why indeterminism prior to the decision typically does not affect intentionality. At least usually, an agent does not acquire her intention to perform a certain action until she decides to perform it. Hence, indeterminism prior to the decision, unlike indeterminism after the action, leaves unaffected the causal process leading from the acquiring of the intention to the result of the action. This seems to explain why the former sort of indeterminism does not undermine intentionality.

My second worry is whether Clarke’s integrated agent-causal account really provides for significantly greater active control than event-causal accounts. On the latter type of account, the agent’s positive active control consists in the action’s being nondeviantly caused by events such as her having certain reasons. According to traditional agent-causal libertarians, this amount of active control is insufficient for free will, since it may not be up to the agent whether the action-causing events occur. If she lacks control over these events, the agent is not a true originator of her action. Given broad incompatibilism, Clarke agrees that this lack of control precludes free will. However, his integrated account does not provide for any more control over the occurrence of the action-causing events, than does an event-causal account. The only relevant difference between these accounts is that, on Clarke’s view, the action-causing events are not causally sufficient, but merely necessary, for the action to occur. But if the agent lacks control over a necessary immediate cause of her action, it seems that she lacks freedom-sufficient active control. The assumption that the agent herself is also a necessary cause of the action is not, it appears, of much help in this regard.

Similarly, it can be questioned whether Clarke’s integrated account substantially improves on pure agent-causal accounts, as regards the problem of reason-explanation. If the agent’s having certain reasons is only a necessary, but not a sufficient immediate cause of her action, it seems doubtful that a reason-explanation of the action can be given. The most we can say is that the agent acted partly for reasons.

Finally, we may note a further problem that any agent-causal account faces, even if the possibility of agent-causation is granted. For an appeal to such causation to be of any help in solving the problem of active control, we must assume that although agents can be causes, they cannot be effects. If an agent is an effect, i.e., a caused substance, it seems that she cannot be an originator of her action, in the strong sense required by agent-causal libertarians. That the agent is not herself caused follows, of course, if substances cannot, as a matter of general principle, be effects. Clarke seems to implicitly make this assumption, perhaps relying on the assumed temporality of causation. Since substances are not occurrences, however, it would be question-begging to rule out substances as effects simply by claiming that effects are, necessarily, caused to occur at specific times. One might instead appeal to a weaker principle, stating that any instance of causation, as distinct from the causal relata involved, must by necessity be temporally located. But it is far from clear that this weaker principle of causal temporality rules out the possibility of substances as effects. It does not seem wildly implausible to claim that a substance is caused at the time at which it is brought into existence. For example, if a human substance starts to exist at the moment of conception, one could claim that it is caused, at that moment, by (events involving) its parents.