Libertarian Free Will: Contemporary Debates

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David Palmer, Libertarian Free Will: Contemporary Debates, Oxford University Press, 2014, 235pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199860081.

Reviewed by Philip Swenson, Rutgers University


This collection focuses on issues, relevant to libertarianism, about free will and moral responsibility. Libertarianism is the view that (a) agents are sometimes free and morally responsible and (b) free will and moral responsibility are incompatible with causal determinism. The essays all interact with aspects of Robert Kane's highly influential libertarian account. Kane contributes an essay responding to the rest of the volume. The essays are of high quality, and many of the main players in the debate are represented.

After an introduction by David Palmer, Carl Ginet kicks things off by critiquing Kane's event-causal account of free will and defending a rival non-causal account. On Kane's view, being directly morally responsible for an act requires performing a "self forming action" (SFA). An SFA occurs when an agent is torn between two incompatible options, the agent makes an effort to perform each of the two options, and it is causally undetermined which effort will win out. On Kane's approach the resulting act is an SFA regardless of which of the two efforts wins out.

Ginet objects that Kane's account is implausible given the phenomenology of torn decisions. We do not experience ourselves trying to perform an act while deciding whether to perform the act. Ginet also argues that Kane's 'competing efforts' approach is unmotivated because it does not help libertarians avoid the luck objection (i.e., the objection that if a choice is undetermined then which option is chosen is just a matter of luck). Ginet claims that if it just a matter of luck which desire causes an act, then it is also just a matter of luck which effort causes an act. So we lack a reason to posit dueling efforts. Ginet also argues that a view on which free choices are completely uncaused provides a better response to the luck objection.

Timothy O'Connor argues that libertarians should reject physicalist accounts of the mental (in part due to the worry that, on physicalism, facts about microphysical states over which we have no control entail each of our choices). He also argues that those who believe in free will should reject causal reductionism. Reductive accounts of causation cannot adequately account for agents producing or directly controlling their actions. Given this, O'Connor suggests that Kane should endorse a "neo-Aristotelian causal powers account" of causation. And on such an account, O'Connor claims, it is natural to take the view that substances, rather than events, are causes. Furthermore, accepting that the agent herself causes her actions allows libertarians to avoid the "problem of the disappearing agent." Thus O'Connor suggests that Kane should endorse agent causation. (In his reply, Kane endorses both event and agent causation.) O'Connor's discussion of reductive accounts of causation brings to light a perhaps under-discussed question that seems worthy of further exploration.

Alfred Mele also objects that Kane's dual efforts account is implausible on phenomenological grounds. He additionally argues that the dual efforts approach does not overcome the luck objection. Kane (1999, p. 227) relies on the fact that in some cases indeterminism "functions as an obstacle to success without precluding responsibility." For example, an assassin might be responsible for a killing even though (given his indeterministic motor-control system) it was not determined his attempt would succeed. Mele, following Randolph Clarke, objects that the assassin must have freely made his attempt in order to be responsible for the result. Similarly, Kane's competing efforts must themselves be free in order to account for the agent's responsibility for an SFA. Kane could claim that the efforts of will are free in a weaker compatibilist sense. But the SFAs are supposed to be free in a more robust sense and Mele asks "How can the freedom of a choice . . . outstrip the freedom of the effort?" (p. 43)

In the second part of his essay Mele suggests a response to the problem of enhanced control (i.e., the challenge of explaining why libertarian accounts of agency provide more control than compatibilist accounts.) Mele suggests that libertarians should claim that they need not show that indeterminism allows for a higher degree or amount of control than determined agents could possess. Rather, indeterminism allows for the presence of a different kind of control: a kind of control that may not be measurable on the same scale as deterministic sorts of control.

John Martin Fischer's essay raises a luck-based worry for Kane quite similar to the worry raised by Mele. Fischer then proposes a solution to the luck objection. Suppose we have a deterministic scenario in which "the requisite glue" between an agent's mental states and choice sufficient to render the choice not-too-lucky is present. Now consider a variant of the story in which there is a genuinely indeterministic machine that will either cause nothing relevant to the scenario or preempt the agent's choice. As it happens, the machine causes nothing. It seems the presence of the machine "is irrelevant to whatever it is that makes it the case that the responsibility-grounding relationship obtains in the sequence flowing through [the agent]." (p. 61) Thus the presence of indeterminism does not remove the requisite glue needed to render actions sufficiently non-lucky.

An approach similar to Fischer's might also be applied to Kane's assassin example. If the requisite glue is present in a deterministic version of the assassin case, it does not seem that adding a small degree of indeterminism in the assassin's motor control system would remove it. Mele's and Fischer's essays might jointly suggest a strategy for libertarians. Libertarians could respond to the problem of luck by granting that the obtaining of the requisite glue is compatible with determinism and then endorsing Fischer's argument that indeterminism need not remove it. Libertarians could then claim, following Mele's suggestion, that determinism nonetheless rules out some kind of control that is (for reasons independent of luck) needed for moral responsibility. A drawback of this strategy is that it involves giving up the natural (for incompatibilists) thought that determinism renders our actions just a matter of luck.

Michael McKenna discusses Kane's claim that an agent's being the ultimate source of her acts is incompatible with determinism. Kane's claim relies on the following necessary condition for sourcehood:

(U) or every X and Y (where X and Y represent occurrences of events and/or states) if the agent is personally responsible for X, and if Y is an arche (or sufficient ground or cause or explanation) for X, then the agent must also be personally responsible for Y. (p. 81, quoting Kane)

McKenna points out that deploying (U) against the compatibilist might be question begging unless some further argument for (U) can be provided. But he acknowledges that (U) can be motivated by manipulation arguments, which arguably reveal that determinism is incompatible with ultimate sourcehood. McKenna suggests that compatibilists resist (U) by accepting that the requirement that "the source of an agent's act be within her" (p. 85), but rejecting the negative claim that there cannot be a further source "of what's within her for which [she] is not also ultimately responsible" (p. 85). He notes that there are many contexts in which no analogue of this negative claim holds for claims about sourcehood.

David Widerker and Ira M. Schnall defend the Direct Argument for incompatibilism from objections that question its dialectical propriety and from purported counterexamples to the rule Transfer NR on which the Direct Argument relies:

Transfer NR: NR(p), NR(p⊃q) ⊢ NR(q)

where "'NR(p)' abbreviates 'p and no one is (now), or ever has been even partially morally responsible for the fact that p'" (p. 89).

In order to circumvent purported counterexamples to Transfer NR involving overdetermination, Widerker and Schnall suggest that Transfer NR be restricted so that it governs only direct responsibility (as opposed to derivative responsibility). In order to avoid another sort of counterexample they also suggest restricting Transfer NR to cases where q is not temporally prior to p. (I note that the counterexample motivating this revision could apparently also be avoided by endorsing the view that one can be morally responsible for facts that lack (positive or negative) moral value.)

Widerker and Schnall suggest that it is ad hoc for compatibilists to restrict Transfer NR in order to accommodate compatibilist intuitions. But given that they suggest two restrictions of Transfer NR themselves in order to capture intuitions about cases, it is not clear that the compatibilist should not make a similar move.

Randolph Clarke contributes a discussion of responsibility for omissions. Clarke argues that in some cases we are responsible for an omission, but our responsibility for the omission cannot be accounted for in terms of actions. He concludes that one can have basic (non-derivative) responsibility for omissions as well as actions. Furthermore, Clarke floats the idea (though he doesn't firmly commit to it) that agents can have basic responsibility for unwitting omissions. Agents need not realize they are omitting to A in order to have basic responsibility for omitting to A. Libertarians may have reason to be skeptical about Clarke's suggestion. Clarke claims that, supposing he has forgotten that he planned to pick up milk from the store, it is still "up to me whether I get the milk." (p. 121) I suspect that at least some libertarians will find the following line of reasoning attractive. (1) It does not occur to Clarke to stop for milk and he has no choice about whether it occurs to him. (2) Necessarily, if it does not occur to him to stop for milk, then he fails to stop for milk. (3) So, he has no choice about whether he fails to stop for milk.

Ishtiyaque Haji critically evaluates Angela Smith's rational relations account of responsibility. He then argues that the possessing of certain attitudes, such as forgiveness and guilt, requires alternative possibilities. To establish this claim, Haji argues that attitudes such as forgiveness essentially involve objective reasons. He then appeals to principles something like the following:

(i) If one has a reason to do A, then one can do A.

(ii) If one has a reason to do A, then one can avoid doing A.[1]

(i) is plausible given its natural fit with 'ought-implies can'. And Haji suggests that principles in the neighborhood of (ii) should also be endorsed on grounds of symmetry. Together, (i) and (ii) commit us to an alternative possibilities requirement on possessing objective reasons.

Suppose you have experienced what appeared to be guilt and forgiveness many times over the course of your life, you then learn that you never had the ability to do otherwise. In my view it would be reasonable to conclude either that principles like (ii) are false or that forgiveness and guilt do not always generate reasons, but only do so when other conditions are met. Either of these conclusions would allow us to reject an alternative possibilities requirement for forgiveness and guilt.

Dana Nelkin and Derk Pereboom both take up the question of what, if anything, renders being an indeterministic originator of an action valuable. They both discuss two proposals from Kane: (a) indeterministic origination allows us to distinguish ourselves from the world and (b) indeterministic origination allows for objectively valuable achievements. Nelkin and Pereboom both argue that these goods can be secured absent indeterminism.

Nelkin also argues that free agency is required for certain kinds of valuable relationships, namely, those in which we hold one another to moral demands. She suggests two routes to this conclusion. First, the reactive attitudes might be both (I) appropriate only in response to free agency and (II) "the only, or best, way" for us to hold one another to moral demands. Second, appropriately holding someone to a demand might itself require free agency. Nelkin does not claim that the relevant sense of free agency is an incompatibilist one.

In his essay Pereboom responds to Nelkin. He accepts that without indeterministic origination 'demands of moral obligation' would be out of place. But he makes use of demands tied to a notion of nondeontological moral wrongness.[2] The idea is that "the possible options for acting" are ranked and that an act is wrong "when its value is low enough in this ranking, in this context [for moral protest to be prima facie justified]" (p. 171). Pereboom suggests that moral demands tied to this notion of wrongness do not presuppose indeterministic origination or the ability to do otherwise. (He also argues that emotions other than the reactive attitudes can underwrite valuable personal relationships.)

Pereboom's notion of wrongness relies on there being "possible options for acting". Presumably the sense of "option" at work is meant to be fairly weak and uncontroversially compatible with determinism. Perhaps those with views similar to Pereboom's might consider claiming that possessing options (in this weak sense) is sufficient to underwrite deontic moral obligations (even if some further libertarian requirement is necessary for moral responsibility). This would allow for full-blooded demands of moral obligation even if determinism is true.

Kane closes the volume by providing a thorough and thoughtful discussion of the preceding essays. I cannot cover the full range of his discussion. But I will briefly lay out a portion of his defense of his account of SFAs. In response to the phenomenological implausibility'objection to his competing efforts view, Kane replies that he does not endorse the view that agents have introspective awareness of making competing efforts. Rather, Kane offers his view as "a theory about what might be going on behind the scenes when we exercise such a free will, not merely a description of what we immediately experience." (p. 197) Kane also defends the claim that making competing efforts can be rational in certain cases. In response to the objection that on his approach the freedom of the SFAs cannot outstrip the freedom of the competing efforts, Kane claims that incompatibilist freedom is not acquired in one fell swoop but is gained stepwise by first exercising compatibilist control over the competing efforts (p. 200). Kane's view is that the freedom of the resulting choice both depends on and outstrips the freedom of the competing efforts.

The brief summaries offered above unfortunately cannot even mention many of the interesting philosophical moves made by the contributors. Overall this book provides high quality discussions of many of the most important issues in the free will debate. It would make excellent reading for anyone interested in the current state of the discussion of Kane's views or of the free will debate in general.


Kane, Robert. (1999) "Responsibility, luck, and chance: Reflections on free will and indeterminism." Journal of Philosophy 96: 217-240

Norcross, Alastair. (2006) "Reasons without demands: Rethinking rightness." In Contemporary Debates in Moral Theory, ed. James Dreier, 38-54. Oxford: Blackwell.

[1] Haji's own principles concern "reasons-wise impermissibility" and "reasons-wise obligation", but I believe (i) and (ii) simplify the argument without reducing its cogency.

[2] Pereboom credits Norcross (2006) with developing the relevant notion of "nondeontologial moral wrongness."