Life and Action: Elementary Structures of Practice and Practical Thought

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Michael Thompson, Life and Action: Elementary Structures of Practice and Practical Thought, Harvard University Press, 2008, 240pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674016705.

Reviewed by Paul Hurley, Claremont McKenna College


Michael Thompson's book Life and Action contains three separate essays. Although these essays can be read in isolation, they are offered as mutually reinforcing components of an overarching project. Thompson argues that ethics must be approached 'from below' through first developing an understanding of the central concepts of 'life-form', 'action', and 'practice'. Each of these three concepts plays a central role in one of the distinct metaphysical strata upon which any effective approach to the traditional questions of ethics must rest. Such an approach is necessary because much recent ethical inquiry is in the grips of an impoverished 'empirical' understanding of such concepts. He sets out both to demonstrate the inadequacy of this 'empirical' metaphysical foundation for ethical inquiry and to articulate, at least in outline, more adequate foundations. The book issues an ambitious set of promissory notes in its introductory chapter. Thompson's attempts to cash them in weave together lines of argument from philosophers, including Hegel, Anscombe, Frege, and Aristotle, whose approaches at first glance do not appear to fit comfortably on the same loom. The result is an exceptional piece of philosophy that is a reservoir of deep insights concerning life, action, and practices. The theory of action developed here, in particular, stands among the most significant contributions to action theory in recent years. It is quite simply a 'must read' for anyone working in the area. Although Thompson's arguments will be of particular interest to philosophers working in action theory and ethics, they have much to offer those with interest in logic, philosophy of biology, metaphysics, philosophy of language, and philosophy of psychology.

In each of the three essays Thompson appeals to Wilfrid Sellars's distinction between the manifest and scientific images to map out the general outlines of his reorienting project. The manifest image is the system of concepts that articulates the common sense world within which deliberating agents operate: "if anything is clear it is that 'the practical' happens in this so-called manifest image." [p. 10] The scientific image is the system of scientific concepts -- atoms and empty space rather than tables, and neural firings rather than rational deliberation. Empirical approaches to the metaphysics underlying ethical inquiry deploy concepts that are articulated within the scientific rather than the manifest image. The result is a profound disconnect between ethics (in the manifest image) and its metaphysical foundations (in the scientific image). The recovery project argues that effective ethical inquiry must avoid this disconnect by recovering concepts of life-form, action, and practice that are properly articulated within the manifest image. Such recovery opens up "the possibility of attaining truth here and there within this supposed image." [p. 10] Productive ethical inquiry requires not just the biological concept of species but the Hegelian concept of life-form, and not just the psychological and sociological concepts of disposition and practice, but a 'narrower' manifest image concept of practice (upon which an ethical disposition is identical with such a practice).

Each of Thompson's core concepts, life-form, action, and practice, is dealt with in one of the three main sections of the book. I will take up each in turn, working upwards (as he does) from the most fundamental stratum of the three, that of life-form.


His approach is perhaps most clearly on display in the first section on life-form. The case for the fundamental role of a manifest image concept of a life-form takes as its point of departure standard empirical scientific accounts of life. Such accounts typically provide a set of criteria for identifying living organisms, but Thompson argues that these criteria, criteria such as reproduction and homeostasis, fail utterly. Crystals, for example, reproduce themselves, and stasis is a striking feature of corpses as well as living organisms. Indeed, to the extent that such criteria are helpful, Thompson argues, it is because they focus upon the reproduction and the maintenance of the distinctive forms of the entities in question and because they "presuppose a grasp of the appropriate category of form," [p. 52] that of a 'life-form':

Vital description of individual organisms is itself the primitive expression of a conception of things in terms of 'life-form' or 'species', and if we want to understand these categories in philosophy we must bring them back to that form of description. [p. 59]

It is not maintenance of the individual or reproduction of the individual that is a sign of vitality, but maintenance or transmission of the form that some particular individual instantiates, and in particular of the appropriate category of form -- life-form (or species). But this does not give us an 'empirical' account of life, it presupposes a decidedly non-scientific image understanding of life-form. The terms referring to living individuals presuppose the 'wider context' of a species or life-form. How, then, do we go about providing an account of 'life-form' within the manifest image? Thompson suggests that a better initial question is not what a life-form is, but "How is such a thing described?" [p. 62] The answer is through recourse to what he labels 'natural historical judgments', judgments that take the form "This S is (or has or does) F," e.g. the domestic cat has four legs, the iris blooms in the spring, or the bobcat has retractable claws. Such judgments, he argues, are "a logically special form of appearance of predicative expression" [p. 76] that resists reduction or assimilation to any other form. Concepts are life-form concepts if they provide a possible subject for this form of judgment.


To appreciate the radical nature of Thompson's theory of action, the topic of his second essay, consider one standard account of the rationalizing of action. On this account it is mental states of the agent such as desires, understood as propositional attitudes (e.g. "I want that I walk to school"), that rationalize actions at the most fundamental level. Such an account, Thompson argues, is mistaken in every respect. It is actions, not mental states, that rationalize actions at the most fundamental level. Intentions and desires do play roles in certain of these rationalizations, but insofar as they do they are not properly characterized as propositional attitudes, nor are they in the sense intended properly characterized as states of the agent.

Central to Thompson's theory of action is his account of 'naïve rationalization'. Naïve rationalization is "the explanation of one action in terms of another." [p. 85] Why am I breaking eggs? Because I am making an omelet. My rationalization for acting is another action. He contrasts such naïve rationalization of actions through appeal to actions with 'sophisticated' rationalization of actions through appeal to wants and intentions: Why am I flipping the switch? Because I want to turn on the light. Thompson's fundamental insight is that "the type of explanation of action at stake in action theory, whether naïve or sophisticated, is uniformly a matter of locating the action explained in what might be called a developing process." [p. 132] Actions, on such an account, can be both the explanans and the explanandum in such a rationalization. To develop this account Thompson draws upon the linguistic distinction between perfectives and imperfectives: what is registered as complete or whole or as 'perfected' in 'I walked to school' or 'I have walked to school' is represented as incomplete or partial or 'imperfect' in 'I was walking to school'. [p. 129] In naïve rationalization, Thompson argues, the ground is always an 'intrinsically imperfective state of affairs'. [p. 129] What of rationalizations that involve 'practical-psychical verbs', such as 'wants', 'intends', and 'tries'? Thompson suggests that properly understood, the function of such verbs in the rationalization of actions is also "to express certain forms of imperfective judgment." [p. 131]

How can this be? When I rationalize my flipping of the switch by pointing out that I want to turn on the light, surely I am appealing to a mental state of mine, an attitude with a non-imperfective propositional content -- my want that I turn on the light. Thompson argues, however, that there is not even a plausible space for propositional attitudes of this latter sort. Indeed, if we consider the various acceptable linguistic forms, i.e. 'that I was turning on the light', 'that I turned on the light', and 'that I am turning on the light', we recognize that there is no 'that I turn on the light'. More precisely, we realize that the only such usage is a habitual usage, as in "I walk to school in the mornings," or "I turn out the light before leaving." The non-imperfective form -- 'I want that I go to the store' rather than 'I want to go to the store' -- has no place, because the relation of all potentially rationalizing judgments to the perfective judgment (e.g. "I flipped the switch") is "in each case the same: what is represented as coiled up or incomplete or partial in them, is represented as unfurled or finished or whole in the other." [p. 131] Thompson closes his essay on actions with an account of how agents equipped merely with naïve rationalization, rationalization of actions with actions, might naturally develop sophisticated rationalizations that appeal to wants and intentions. Such an account, however, allows us to see that such sophisticated rationalizations are properly understood as occupying the same "categorical space" as actions, "the space of kinesis, if you like, and not of stasis." [p. 134] Actions are rationalized not by psychological states but by actions and processes in the same categorial space as the actions that the agent [presumably] takes to be rationalized.


Whereas the essay on action offers a comprehensive alternative to prevailing theories of action, the final essay on practices and dispositions is far more schematic. Here Thompson focuses initially upon the challenges confronting attempts to provide an adequate account of promising. Whether such attempts take the form of arguments for the rationality of dispositions to keep one's promises (e.g. Gauthier and Foot), or that of arguments for the morality of the practice of keeping promises (e.g. the early Rawls), the central challenge to such accounts of dispositions and practices is presented by what Thompson characterizes as 'tight corners' cases, cases in which "goods and evils to be pursued and avoided … would make the faithful person's conduct either morally blameworthy or imprudent if it were pursued by a similarly situated person, but one who had not made a promise." [p. 153] In tight corners cases, a disposition or practice that typically furthers the interests of rational agents, or maximizes overall utility, appears instead to thwart those interests or to result in less utility overall. The puzzle is how the "promise, the 'dead hand of the past', is supposed to overturn the calculation" in such cases [p. 153].

Although Thompson takes the accounts of dispositions and practices offered by Foot, Gauthier, and the early Rawls to be suggestive, he argues that such concepts taken from the scientific image, from psychology and sociology, cannot deal successfully with tight corners cases. To sketch an alternative manifest image account of practices and dispositions, Thompson has recourse to a parallel with the concept of a life-form that he developed in the first essay. This concept of a life-form is different from and less determinate than the concept of a species that is deployed in biology; so too the "practical-philosophical conception of a practice" is a manifest image conception that is less determinate than the conception deployed in the social sciences. Organisms are bearers of life-forms; agents are bearers of practices. The same life-form is instanced in other individual organisms; the same practice is instanced in other agents. The life-form is a measure of good and bad for the organisms that bear it; the practice "acts as a standard or measure of genuine good in the individual operations of the agents who bear it." [p. 199] Moreover, each, the life-form and the practice, "can account for what is reckoned good according to that measure." [p. 208]

Thompson's project invites challenges at many levels. The appeal to the concept of life-form, Thompson argues, provides a standard of goodness for individual organisms. So too, he argues, the appeal to the concept of a practice provides a standard of goodness for agents and their actions. But 'better' in the life-form case seems an extremely thin and tenuous standard. It is the relevant natural historical judgments that provide the standards for such evaluative judgments, but in many cases mutations that diverge from such 'standards' appear to result in a better organism. The standards provided by natural historical judgments seem often to allow space for non-standard variations that are improvements. The yellow finch mates in the spring, but is a deviant finch that mates in the fall as well worse (defective) or better? Such concerns would appear to be magnified in the case of practices. Practices certainly provide a measure of good and bad in what bears them, but the thin sense in which this is true ranges over vicious and destructive practices as well, and requires considerable augmentation before it can provide the resources to distinguish bad practices.

Thompson's theory of action is dazzling -- deep, original, revolutionary, and in certain respects (I suspect) just plain right. Nonetheless, it invites critical engagement on many levels. He defends at some length a very specific claim that wanting to do A is entailed by intending to do A, arguing that it is "the most certain" of the many entailment relations that he defends [p. 104]. He takes intuitions to the contrary to be due to certain peculiarities regarding the word "want," but there seem to be solid grounds for challenging this entailment even with the relevant peculiarities clarified. In particular, I suspect that in cases of weakness of the will it is precisely the entailment between Thompson's preferred sense of wanting and intending that becomes problematic. The akratic agent has a desire/appetite/urge to do A, and because she is weak willed intends to do A, but does she want to do A? A more general worry is that Thompson's theory of action provides an account, in effect, only of relative rationalization. Actions are rationalized by actions, but only if the rationalizing actions are themselves rationalized. Rationalizing these latter actions through appeal to yet other actions seems only to postpone the day of reckoning. It may well not be the task of a theory of action per se to provide the necessary account of non-relative rationalization. Moreover, it may well be that the account of manifest image practices is intended to provide the beginning of an account of such non-relative rationalization of actions. But here the aforementioned concerns about the thinness of the measure of good and bad provided by the account of practices are relevant. Certain aspects of a Kantian or neo-Kantian approach to ethics are thrown out the front door by Thompson in the introductory chapter, but I am left wondering whether others will have to be brought in through the side window to provide a sufficiently robust account of non-relative rationalization.