Life, Liberty, and the Pursuit of Utility: Happiness in Philosophical and Economic Thought

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Anthony Kenny and Charles Kenny, Life, Liberty, and the Pursuit of Utility: Happiness in Philosophical and Economic Thought, Imprint Academic, 2006, 227pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 1845400526.

Reviewed by Christopher Toner, Air University


The Kennys' book, the seventh volume of the St. Andrews Studies in Philosophy and Public Affairs series, comprises an analysis of human happiness and a study of what factors imperil or contribute to it, together with a number of normative recommendations concerning its pursuit by individuals and communities. It is co-authored by father and son, philosopher and economist respectively, and brings to bear both conceptual analysis and empirical research. The book's main thrust is to promote a greater sensitivity to these factors and the recognition of global responsibility for promoting the happiness of individuals in a better-informed way. The book's title is, of course, a play on the words from the American Declaration of Independence, and the authors take life, liberty, and happiness -- recast as welfare, dignity, and contentment -- to be the three components of human well-being (or happiness in a sense broader than just contentment). These components determine the structure of the book, with a section devoted to each, bounded on one side by a historical introduction and on the other by moral and political policy recommendations. Each section consists of two chapters, with the first written by Anthony, and the second by Charles Kenny. I will give a brief overview of each section, and then turn to some critical points.

The first section comprises chapters on "The Philosophy of Happiness" and "Happiness in History." The former traces philosophical reflections on happiness from Aristotle through Sidgwick, and provides a good example of the breathtaking pace sometimes assumed in the book: Aristotle, the Epicureans and Stoics, Augustine, Aquinas, Scotus, Kant, and the utilitarians are mown through in rapid succession. And all this before taking up threads from the work of economists and psychologists. Of course this is intended as a survey, but the authors do draw a substantive conclusion from it: No one has succeeded in establishing any unified conception of happiness, and "when we pursue happiness for ourselves or for others, the goal is not a simple but a complex one, and if we are trying to measure well-being, a single metric will not suffice" (43). Because of this, I suspect both utilitarians and Aristotelians will feel they have been badly treated by the authors' extremely quick rejections of their accounts of happiness (the attribution of self-centeredness to Aristotle, for example, is made with little argument, even though this is a contentious point). However that may be, the authors put together their own account of well-being using items lifted in passing from the rejected philosophies: contentment from the utilitarians, dignity from the Aristotelians, and material welfare from a common consensus as to its importance. The three elements are seen as logically independent, but empirically correlated. The intelligent pursuit of happiness, however, will often involve making trade-offs among the elements. The latter chapter is concerned to show that a generally acceptable level of well-being seems to have been achieved by many throughout recorded history, and without the benefits of the recent explosive growth in healthcare and average income. This criticism of excessive focus upon economic growth and average income will be a leitmotif of the book.

The second section deals with welfare understood as "the satisfaction of animal needs -- food, drink, shelter and other things that contribute to 'bodily flourishing,'" and consists of chapters on "The Goods of the Body" and "The Determinants of Welfare." The first of these is a brief historical survey of the role of welfare thus understood in philosophical thought. The second surveys a range of factors that bear upon welfare, including income, availability of healthcare, strength of public institutions, and stability and peace. A major claim of the chapter is that empirical research reveals a surprisingly weak correlation between income and welfare -- much more is achieved through low-cost means such as publicly run immunization programs.

The next section is concerned with dignity, and its first chapter is an analysis of dignity in terms of its essential components, "Choice, Worth, and Prestige." A dignified life, the authors maintain, involves a power of choice in a range of domains, most importantly those of cultural identity, social role, and the political arrangements under which one lives. Dignity also requires worth, most notably that one's work and leisure are seen as valuable by oneself and one's society. And finally dignity also involves some degree of prestige (and this word is chosen because the search for respect is often competitive). The chapter concludes with the example of St. Simeon Stylites, a poor hermit who lived on top of a pillar, yet clearly met all the requirements of dignity. The second chapter, "The Economics of Dignity," bears this example out (without making a universal recommendation of it!). Above a certain low minimum, not much income is required for dignity. Civil rights, including protections for women and ethnic minorities, and opportunities for education and meaningful work are more relevant. Even in the case of prestige, it is relative rather than absolute income that seems important to people.

The authors turn finally to contentment, beginning with the chapter on "Mental States and Their Measurement." Although contentment is related to pleasure, in the sense that a contented life will contain pleasures, the two are not the same. Contentment consists, rather, in the belief that one's desires are largely being satisfied. Moreover, we need to distinguish between immediate, animal desires and the long-term desires that are "peculiar to language users" -- it is the satisfaction of the latter that is "at the heart of contentment." The chapter also begins a critical assessment of how we go about attributing mental states, which is continued in the chapter on "Subjective Well-Being and Its Correlates." Happiness polling is a flourishing industry, and the authors allow that, despite a number of problems that call for caution, its results seem to be generally reliable. But what do they show? If anything, that a conservative approach to policy is best here. Most people seem to be fairly content if well-provisioned with fairly simple things -- family, friends, and faith are mentioned. Studies seem to show further that most people have a "set point" of contentment (or perhaps a fairly narrow set range), which is largely determined by inheritance and maintained by adaptation to circumstances. To the extent that there is a causal connection between contentment and social status, say, or employment, it seems likely that the causation may well flow from contentment to these correlates! The chapter concludes with an amusing portrayal of the "dystopian nightmare" that would follow from "too singular a focus on utilitarianism based on subjective well-being," including forced multiple mating of those who score highly on polls (due to the genetic component of the set point) and the sterilization and drugging of those who score low. One positive policy recommendation the authors are prepared to make is focusing on "non-rival" correlates of contentment, such as liberal holiday leave policies, rather than more competitive "positional" goods such as relatively high income.

The concluding section begins with the chapter on "Happiness and Morality." Any moral system, we are told, requires a community, a set of moral values, and a code or set of prohibitions. The authors maintain that at least some of these prohibitions, such as those against murder or torture, hold regardless of the consequences -- this gives rise to certain negative rights. There are also positive rights, and the authors mention the pursuit of happiness. This right is not absolute, at least in the sense that we are not permitted to pursue happiness by any means. We are psychologically able, and morally required, to pursue more than just our own happiness. But we are not required to pursue some maximal amount of happiness in the world; indeed the authors maintain that "such maximization is a chimerical goal for moral or political policy." We would do better to look to the Stoic process of oikeiosis, "reaching out and making ever wider circles into parts of one's home environment." But the complexity of the modern world ensures that we cannot look to classical moral theory for any detailed guidance in how to put this into practice; we must turn to the final chapter, "Policies for Happiness." States are portrayed here as responsible for securing minimal levels of welfare and dignity for their constituents and for putting in place "other conditions that allow all the possibility for achieving individual happiness." States then should universally provide or ensure a "basic package of goods" such as minimal income, healthcare, security, and education -- such would sustain people and ensure that they "can take part in society without shame," and thus go a long way toward distributing welfare and dignity at a fairly low cost. Most countries can achieve this with fairly non-disruptive transfers of wealth within their borders. (Also recommended here are "mechanisms of transparency" to discourage corruption, and reductions in military expenditures.) Countries that can achieve this goal also have a global responsibility to help countries who cannot by themselves do so.  There is no reason, the authors maintain, that something like a "globalization of Rawls's difference principle," or at least a global guarantee of a minimal level of welfare, cannot be put into place. Such reforms could be effected by such policies as more open borders, freer trade, and direct aid supplemented by certain reforms to reduce corruption and enhance the efficacy of transfer.

I will contend, in a moment, that the argument of this chapter moves far too quickly to be compelling. This brevity, bordering at points on breeziness, is what I take to be the chief shortcoming of the book. Granted, given the aim of the St. Andrews series (advancing the contribution of philosophy to "topics of public importance"), and given its joint authorship and combination of disciplinary perspectives, this book presumably takes as its audience the "generally educated public," and this target audience probably accounts for, and to some degree justifies, a steering clear of certain contested waters. On occasion, however, this leads the authors to pass too lightly over substantive and contentious points that are critical to the argument of the book, points that left unresolved leave important conclusions in doubt.

I turn first to the analysis of happiness into welfare, dignity, and contentment, seen as related but separable and unresolvable into any deeper unified conception (let alone metric) of well-being. Some of the book's main conclusions hinge on this "cluster concept" of well-being -- it is on this basis that the authors see maximization as chimerical and recommend the pursuit of tradeoffs. The complaints from eudaimonists and utilitarians that I anticipated, then, would not be simply defensive reactions, but could constitute serious objections to the book's main argument. (Eudaimonists, of course, would not recommend a policy of maximization, but would likely want to defend a more unified conception of the common good.) One might, then, have hoped for some more detailed engagement with recent eudaimonist literature on the common good (MacIntyre's, for example), or with sophisticated utilitarian writing on well-being (perhaps L.W. Sumner's in particular), which attempt to elucidate complex but unified understandings of human happiness that integrate elements similar to what the authors call welfare, dignity, and contentment. Do the authors think such attempts must fail, and why; or if not what would be the implications of success for the project of this book?

And what of the strong redistributive recommendations with which the book concludes? I have no wish to quarrel with the claim that those who are well-off have a moral obligation to help those who are less well-off (although I am not sure that this is best justified in terms of a right to happiness). My worry is that it is not so clear how the authors move from that moral claim to the political claim endorsing global redistributive policies, presumably backed by the coercive instruments of political power. They do pause to consider what we might think of as "libertarian" and "communitarian" objections to such redistribution, objections based on individual and communal property rights: There is "no such thing as a 'natural' absolute right to property, … Property is very much a construct of society." Moreover the distribution of wealth among nations, and borders between them, are "largely the accidents of history." I do not think libertarians or communitarians will feel adequately answered by such arguments, which seem to turn on how we weigh various non-absolute rights (natural or otherwise) against each other. In any event, these arguments are responses to objections to the use of coercive political power -- my worry, however, is that we have not yet been given an otherwise sufficient reason for its use in the first place. The fact that something (such as a fairer distribution) should be the case does not yet give me, or those with power, the right to make it so, much less to force others to make it so. Perhaps the authors are calling for widespread popular political support for such redistribution, seeing such support as granting the authority for it. And perhaps a case could be made along such lines, but although we can guess how premises drawn from the book could be put together into an argument, I do not see that the authors actually make it.

But perhaps, although they do speak of "policy conclusions," the authors intend all this primarily as a spur to a better-informed discussion and debate about the proper goals and forms of distribution, both in the public and among policy makers. Taken in this way, I think the effort does succeed. This is very much a worthwhile book. It usefully synthesizes literatures and arguments from philosophy and economics, and shows how they bear on moral and political deliberations about happiness. It does not say the last word on much -- nor in the end do I think that was the authors' intention -- but it makes a number of opening moves that deserve serious consideration.