Locke and Leibniz on Substance

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Paul Lodge and Tom Stoneham (eds.), Locke and Leibniz on Substance, Routledge, 2015, 259pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138791978.

Reviewed by Margaret Atherton, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


This collection took its start from a memorial conference for Roger Woolhouse. This conference was originally billed as a conference on substance in Early Modern Philosophy, but almost all of the papers, the editors tell us, turned out to be about Locke or Leibniz; hence the volume's title. One thing this means, however, is that the authors of the various papers felt no call to set Locke and Leibniz in conversation in their individual works, and in fact, there is no overlap in the issues discussed by those writing on each figure. The texts in which the two philosophers work out their positions on substance present a different set of problems for commentators, with those writing about Locke needing to grapple with the nature and extent of Locke's agnosticism about substance, while Leibniz scholars must examine and account for the many and varied things Leibniz thought could be known about substance. What the resulting volume provides is a version of the current state of play, first among scholars of Locke and then of Leibniz. The papers themselves, although within their separate grouping also quite different, are models of philosophical scholarship, and the whole repays close study. I will have something to say about each paper.

The first two pieces, Peter Millican's "Locke on Substance and Our Ideas of Substances" and Han-Kyul Kim's "The Supposed but Unknown: A Functionalist Account of Locke's Substratum", address a similar general issue. Locke insists that an idea of "pure substance in general" plays an important role, although he also insists that such an idea is obscure at best. Both Millican and Kim frame their discussions by situating them against a previously prevalent account, the "bare particular" view, which holds that substance is a featureless support for qualities. Both reject this account on cogent grounds. Millican offers a number of reasons, including one he shares with Kim, namely, that when Locke calls the nature of substance unknown, contexts make clear that he thinks that substance in fact has a nature, albeit one that we are not in a position to know very much about. They each go on beyond this now widely accepted view to offer novel accounts of Locke's project with respect to substance.

Millican's approach returns to Locke's earlier Drafts A and B. He discovers that in Draft A, in the passage that was to become the initial sections of chapter 2.23 on complex ideas of substances, Locke spoke not of substance but of matter. Locke's language changed in Draft B as he began to think more about spirits, shifting from 'substance or matter' to 'substance'. The implication Millican draws is that the idea that Locke at first found obscure and confused was in fact that of matter. Thus Locke's agnosticism was directed, Millican suggests, first to any account of the material stuff out of which things were composed, including that of Boylean corpuscularianism and then, subsequently, to any similar account of spiritual substance. This is a surprising and intriguing result, not just because many regard Locke as a defender of Boyle but because it is widely held that Locke thought we did have an idea of matter or body in the form of the ideas we have of primary qualities.

Kim, as it turns out, provides a more elaborate justification for just such a view. He takes his cue from Locke's claim that we don't know what substance is but only what it does to develop a functionalist account of the role substance plays for Locke. Kim's suggestion is that we take Locke's account of complex ideas of substances as consisting in two role-players, a set of qualities identified by their causal role and something playing the role of a unifier of qualities. So described, Kim's insight is that intrinsic properties of substance are always unknown since we know them in terms of the roles they play as we experience them. A consequence he draws out is that this role player can never be unpacked into any particular microscopic substructure, as it might be of corpuscles. The components of such a substructure have to be understood themselves as consisting of an otherwise unknown role-player bearing qualities and powers. Based on different sets of evidence, Millican and Kim reach similar conclusions, namely, that Locke's epistemic humility, in Kim's term, goes all the way down. He is not prepared to endorse any theory of matter or to assume that at some later date the secrets of the universe will be uncovered.

The third piece, Donald L.M. Baxter's "Hume on Substance: A Critique of Locke" is unfortunately placed for a number of reasons. It is an intricate account of Hume's approach to the idea of substance, but it is not really about Locke at all. Baxter's references to Locke consist in otherwise unsubstantiated remarks that Hume is addressing to Locke's "bare particular" view of substance. Coming as it does right after two very convincing cases that Locke does not hold such a view, it can only undercut Baxter's interesting account of Hume. It is true that most readers of volumes like this do not, unlike myself, proceed in a stately fashion from cover to cover, but I think Baxter's ideas about Hume deserve an outing in another venue.

The next three chapters all center on the way substance is to be understood in chapter 2.27 of Locke's Essay on identity and diversity. Martha Brandt Bolton ("Locke's Account of Substance in Light of His General Theory of Identity") is interested in issues that have emerged about Locke's place-time-kind principle for individuating entities. In particular, the view is that Locke is committed to identifying things like plants and masses of matter as belonging to the same kind, body, with the result that oaks and the matter from which they are composed could not exist at the same place and time. Bolton presents an ingenious, if complex, solution to this problem. We must recognize, she says, that wherever Locke is talking about kinds with respect to bodies, he is relying on an ontology that is required by corpuscularian mechanism and so picks out uniformly solid and extended material substance. When we sort entities into kinds, however, we do it with reference to the internal constitution of bodies. These entities falling into kinds, although sometimes called substances by Locke, are not, according to Bolton, strictly speaking substances but substance analogues because ontologically they are composites of substances and modes or relations. Thus, the individuation problem is solved because bodies, or masses of matter, are not strictly speaking of the same kind as plants or animals. My concern with respect to this solution is that much of the ontological material Bolton uses to arrive at it, while supported by a general account of corpuscularian mechanism as it appears in a number of philosophers, like Boyle or Descartes, is not fully supported or perhaps even fully supportable by passages in the Essay.

Lex Newman takes another approach in "Locke on Substance, Consciousness, and Personal Identity", also addressing an issue from 2.27 but concerning personal identity. He proposes that Locke is not attempting to offer an alternative metaphysical account of what constitutes the identity of a self over time but instead is merely developing an epistemic account of the circumstances under which we would say we are the same person then as now. The thought experiments Locke lays out are not designed to reflect alternative realities but to test our intuitions. There are some clear benefits, Newman points out, to this way of looking at things. Among them are that he is able to dismiss the puzzles arising from non-veridical memories since such memories are not intended on Newman's view to be constructive of a self but only to include what we would take to belong to ourselves at a time. What is important, it emerges, about Newman's account is that Locke might very well suppose we are the same substance throughout our lives. This is something, given our confused idea of substance, we will never know. But what each of us can do from a first person subjective account is to identify that which is "mine". Newman does not, that is, see Locke in 2.27 as indulging in metaphysics but rather as continuing his exploration of the construction of our ideas.

Samuel C. Rickless' title, "Are Locke's Persons Modes or Substances?", raises a question that has been recently much discussed. Rickless, however, takes on only a small piece of this literature, the account given by Antonia LoLordo in "Person, Substance, Mode and 'the moral Man' in Locke's Philosophy" (Canadian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 40, 2010). Rickless identifies four arguments from this paper seeking to establish that persons for Locke are modes. He finds all these arguments wanting and concludes by agreeing with Vere Chappell that, since Locke clearly thinks persons are agents, a passage from 2.21.16 saying "that Powers belong only to Agents, and are Attributes only of Substances" amounts to a proof text of the view that persons as far as Locke is concerned are substances.

Lisa Downing ("Locke's Choice between Materialism and Dualism") raises a new question that has not yet been widely discussed. While Locke notoriously opened up the possibility of thinking matter, opinions have varied about how seriously Locke took this possibility. Downing makes clear that the one position we can be sure Locke held is that neither dualism nor materialism is provable. But if we ask which position he found more probable, it is not obvious he would have found materialism the more likely option. Downing explores this possibility by looking at what Locke had to say about thought in animals and finds that, since animals have some cognitive functions, it is hard to find an argument that the ones they lack require an immaterial mind. Downing finally concludes that what the hypothesis of thinking matter would require Locke to believe is that one and the same real essence could support both solidity and thinking, that is, could support the nominal essences of both mind and body. To believe this, however, is just to believe there may be more to matter than we can at present grasp, and this we know is something Locke found very hard not to believe. Downing is both judicious in the way in which she even-handedly lays out where things stand on this matter and challenging in its conclusions.

In the first of the papers about Leibniz, "Leibniz on Substance in the Discourse on Metaphysics", Gonzalo Rodrigues-Pereyra provides an elucidation of the definition of a substance found in section 8 of the Discourse. Rodriguez-Pereyra makes the case that when Leibniz's account of substance is assumed to be directly falling out of his Concept Containment theory of truth, also presented in section 8, the resulting definition does not apply uniquely to substances but to attributes as well since it can also be said of them that all of the predicates are contained in the subject. The result Rodriguez-Pereyra wants to draw is that there are actually two kinds of attributes, only one of which, those like "kinghood", are complete, while others, like "being king", are not, because they apply to subjects other than themselves. He points out that this distinction seems to capture what Leibniz has elsewhere described as full and complete concepts. Rodriguez-Pereyra concludes that while, on this account, Leibniz can distinguish substance from attribute, he would not be able to distinguish adequately between a substance and its substantial form.

In "Perception and Individuality in the Leibnizian Conception of Substance", Anne-Lise Rey delves deeply into the complexities of Leibniz's later metaphysics. The story she wants to tell is complex and detailed, and I do not have space to do justice to her entire argument. Suffice it to say that she holds that issues concerning the unity of substance have been overplayed by commentators such as Ohad Nachtomy and Brandon Look. She suggests that by focusing on Leibniz's introduction of dynamics and then on his version of entelechy, it becomes possible to understand the role of perception as an account of individuation and of monadic domination and subordination. This is an impressively complex piece.

In "Leibniz on Created Substance and Occasionalism", Paul Lodge looks at Leibniz's various direct arguments against occasionalism. He canvasses Leibniz's arguments, first for the essential activity of substance and then examines those that seek to show that substance cannot be passive. Lodge's conclusion is that none of these explicit arguments would seriously trouble occasionalists. The only positive argument Leibniz makes is a posteriori, and he repeatedly ducked De Volder's requests for an a priori argument. The a posteriori argument hangs on our own experience of ourselves as active, evidence occasionalists would not accept as holding of bodies as well as minds. Lodge proposes that Leibniz had the makings of an a priori argument in his account of creation, which Leibniz supposes consists in limited emendations from God's essence and so could be argued must be active, but this argument is only as good as Leibniz's account of creation. Lodge concludes by suggesting that Leibniz's actual or better reasons for rejecting occasionalism can be found in many of his arguments against the necessary presupposition of occasionalists that extended matter exists.

The focus of John Whipple's "Leibniz on Substance and Causation", like Lodge's, is on Leibniz's account of causation. Leibniz, Whipple points out, clearly wanted to reject occasionalism on the one hand, as well as mere conservationism on the other, but seems frequently to toggle back and forth dangerously near each extreme. Whipple wants to make the case that Leibniz does have a middle ground, although not the concurrentism that Jeffrey McDonough attributes to Leibniz. According to Whipple, Leibniz's middle ground rejects ontological assumptions made by all three standard positions. In (very) brief, Whipple thinks that interpreters of Leibniz get into trouble because they accept the ontological reality of successive states of finite creatures. He proposes that we take Leibniz to hold that God's creation of finite substances at the deepest level of reality are non-spatial and atemporal. This fully real level is to be distinguished from Leibniz's two other levels, the phenomenal level of bodies and motion and the ideal level of space and time, which is less real than the former. Thus distinctions among specified states in succession, assumed to be real on most accounts, actually only exist at the phenomenal level and can be understood to be wholly and immediately dependent on God at the deepest level.

Maria Rosa Antognazza ("Leibniz's Theory of Substance and his Metaphysics of the Incarnation") explores Leibniz's changing use of analogies between the union of mind and body and of the union of divine and human nature expressed in the doctrine of the Incarnation. What is key for Leibniz is that the doctrine of the Incarnation does not express a contradiction. Antognazza shows that, while in both his early and mature works, Leibniz exploits an analogy with the union of mind and body as a way of thinking about the union of divine and human nature in Christ, in the later correspondence with Des Bosses, Leibniz begins to show qualms about accounts resting on pre-established harmony and a relation with a dominant monad to provide a suitable comparison. Instead he seems ready to suggest that a metaphysical union that can establish a unum per se is necessary in the case of the Incarnation.

Weighing in at $140, it is unlikely this volume will find a place in many personal libraries. Indeed, price aside, the diversity of its contents makes it unlikely that many individuals will want to buy it. This is unfortunate because I think a great many people would find some of the articles central to their research. Indeed, I hope a number of admirable papers will not languish unread in an expensive and rather disparate volume. Out of thirteen papers, four are by women, so the collection more than meets the rather low bar set by the Gendered Colloquium Campaign of including at least one woman. The women tend to be pretty well known senior scholars, leading one to suspect that it is still a smaller handful of women's names that come to mind for conveners of colloquium or editors of volumes.