Locke on Personal Identity: Consciousness and Concernment

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Galen Strawson, Locke on Personal Identity: Consciousness and Concernment, Princeton University Press, 2011, 259pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691147574.

Reviewed by William Uzgalis, Oregon State University


Strawson's book is focused on interpreting Locke's chapter "Of Identity and Diversity" added to the second edition of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding in 1694. Strawson follows in the footsteps of Edmund Law's 'mode' interpretation of Locke's account of personal identity -- that is, Strawson sees Locke's account of personal identity as restricted to the forensic nature of personal identity much as Law did. Strawson contrasts his reading with what he regards as mistaken readings of Locke on personal identity, dating back to Bishops Berkeley and Butler as well as Thomas Reid, though as he says he only criticizes other accounts indirectly (p. 3). The discussion of the fatal error passage in sec. 13 of II.xxvii is the point at which the contrast between Strawson's interpretation and that of others is at its sharpest. Besides these readings of Locke, Strawson also rejects neo-Lockean interpretations of Locke's account of personal identity as a memory theory. Consciousness, he insists, is different from memory. I will take up this point in a brief discussion of concernment at the end of this review.

The book is divided into twenty chapters (some of them very short), a Postface and two Appendices. The book, as Strawson himself says, "lacks a standard expository structure," as the chapters represent Strawson's line of thought as he read and reread II.xxvii. The first Appendix has Locke's chapter "Of Identity and Diversity" on one page with a rendering of the chapter into modern English and using the technical terms Strawson employs in the book on the facing page. It is intended for students not up to Locke's seventeenth-century English. The second Appendix is a transcription of the first edition of Edmund Law's "Defense of Mr. Locke's Opinion on Personal Identity." As the book lacks a standard expository structure, it is perhaps best to simply try to articulate the interpretation and then discuss it.

In the Postface Strawson remarks: "Locke's theory of personal identity links four fundamental notions: identity, consciousness, concern, and responsibility." (p. 157) On Strawson's view, the crucial feature of Lockean persons (or Persons as he calls them to distinguish this meaning from other senses of the word) is their forensic character. This means that the forensic or Lockean Person is a mode or an aspect of some other kind of person, and that other kind of person is a subject of experience that is constituted by either a living human body, or a body and a soul. Concernment and responsibility follow from the nature of consciousness, which has pleasure and pain as its inevitable concomitants. While Strawson doesn't say this, presumably obeying the law, civil or natural, maximizes pleasure and minimizes pain. Hence the connection between consciousness and morality.

Strawson distinguishes among three different meanings of 'person.' The first (person1) is the ordinary sense of 'person' as a spatio-temporal continuant: a human being, a living human body, perhaps with a soul or perhaps not, at any rate, a substance. The second (person2) is person as 'personality,' as in "I am not the same man I used to be." And finally we have Lockean persons (person3), the mode, which is the moral identity aspect of person1. The identity conditions for these kinds of persons are progressively looser. The identity conditions for human beings are relatively unproblematic -- it is an ordinary continuant to which substance sortal terms apply. Personality has a much more fluid boundary, and finally persons can be gappy and need not be continuants, though they are long lasting on Locke's view.

Subjects of experience (a term Locke never used) are the normal continuants of which person3s are modes. Lockean person3s are just one aspect of a human being. This unanalyzed continuant provides the set of actions, some of which a person3 is conscious of and has a relation of moral concern for. Since the subset of actions that a human subject of experience (person1) is conscious of and concerned with changes over time, it is likely, indeed inevitable, that there will be more than one person3 for each of the vast bulk of human beings.

Now we come to sec. 13 and the passage on the fatal error on Judgment Day. In sec. 13 Locke makes the point that if consciousness can be transferred from one substance to another, then that consciousness must be a representation of an action done rather than the reflex act itself. The problematic claim is that if the consciousness of our actions are representations, then a representation of an action done by one substance might be transferred to another and so the second unjustly punished for some terrible deed the first did. Strawson holds that what he calls "the radical theory" that consciousness makes personal identity is incompatible with unjust transfers, so one has to give up one or the other. For, on the radical theory, if consciousness of an action done by substance #1 is transferred to substance #2, substance #2 becomes the person to whom that action belongs and hence there is no injustice. Strawson takes this to show that the radical theory is incompatible with unjust transfers and so cannot be true without qualification. The alternative is Locke made a gross and obvious mistake in thinking that unjust transfers were possible. Strawson rejects that claim.

Now, how is it possible for an unjust transfer to occur? First, Strawson distinguishes between two uses of such terms as intellectual substances and agent. One of these involves the soul or other intellectual substance that thinks in us -- a non-person use of these terms. The second is a person use. Strawson points out that Locke wants the conclusion that transfers of consciousness from one intellectual substance to another that preserve personal identity are possible. These, he claims, are compatible with his first non-person sense of these terms. He claims that unjust transfers, however, require the view that some transfers of consciousness of actions or experiences go not just from one intellectual substance to another but from one person to another, and thus involve the second sense. God only punishes persons. (p. 126) So some transfers of consciousness preserve personal identity and some don't.

A consequence of this view of unjust transfers is that Locke has introduced into his account what Sydney Shoemaker later called q-memory. (cf. p. 112, n. 1) Q-memory is a form of memory that allows that we may recall from the inside other people's actions and experiences. Shoemaker introduced this notion to save neo-Lockean theories (if not Locke himself) from the charge of circularity. Locke leaves it to the goodness of God to prevent these q-memory cases of unjust transfer, with the result that there are only personal identity preserving transfers of consciousness from one intellectual substance to another. (p. 115)

Strawson himself is quite averse to q-memory because it seems to imply the radical theory that he rejects and he thinks his account solves the problem of circularity without it. He has a thought experiment to show that at least one case of q-memory is incoherent. This is a case where a thousand different experiences from a thousand different people with different sexes, sexual orientations, and characters are transferred to a single individual. This would produce what Strawson calls a "stew-pot person," and Strawson argues that such a notion of 'person' would be incoherent and so, once again, the radical theory is wrong.

Strawson thinks Locke does not believe the radical theory and has another account of personal identity in mind. Strawson writes,

Locke simply assumes the diachronically continuous existence of a subject of experience [S], a human being, say, whom we may call John. He takes John's diachronic identity or continuity as given, while stressing that it isn't a function of the diachronic identity or continuity of his substantial realizers across time. (pp. 121-122)

John as a person3 is distinct from any action that John the human being, the subject of experience, may have performed; for while John is a thinking, intelligent being with reason and reflection who can consider himself the same thinking thing in different times and places, it is possible that John has had amnesia and can't presently remember any past experiences. But when we want to determine John's personal identity, Strawson continues,

We already have a sharply bounded set of actions and experiences with respect to which we are to raise the question of John's Personal identity (or moral or legal responsibility). Which set is this? It's the complete lifelong set of experiences of John the human subject of experience. The actions and experiences of which John is Conscious, and which therefore form a part of his Personal identity, are a (small) subset of the complete set of the actions and experiences of John the human subject of experience. (p. 122)

The problem of circularity, according to Strawson, is that Locke seems to be assuming some notion of personal identity over and above the radical claim that consciousness alone makes personal identity. His account solves the problem of circularity by admitting that there is such a component -- the human being -- and restricting the radical claim to the forensic mode of personal identity, yielding a gappy mode of a human being (a person3), and not the full human being that is presupposed.

In discussing the forensic nature of personal identity, Strawson focuses on Locke's remark that pleasure and pain are the inevitable concomitants of consciousness. Strawson holds that neo-Lockean theories treat memory as equivalent to consciousness and Strawson thinks this is a mistake. Following Marya Schechtman, he sees Lockean consciousness as involving an affective component that is connected to concern rather than being a strictly epistemological faculty such as memory.

There are a number of things I like very much about Strawson's interpretation. Strawson asks fine questions and struggles to explain difficult parts of the text. I think Strawson is correct that the radical theory that consciousness alone makes personal identity cannot be true without qualification (pp. 120-124). I think his proposal that the life of a human being provides a limited set of actions, actions for which persons associated with that human being can legitimately be held responsible, focuses attention on what is wrong with the radical theory. On the radical theory there is, in principle, no limit to the actions that one might be responsible for. All that would be required is that one somehow becomes conscious of them. There needs to be a limit, though I am dubious that Strawson's is the correct account of the limit for reasons provided below. I also think he is correct that the forensic nature of personal identity is crucial to Locke's account of persons and personal identity. Strawson's discussion of concernment and responsibility is, to my mind, the most original part of the book, though probably also the farthest removed from Locke's chapter in the sense of being direct commentary on it.

Now we come to problems with the interpretation. The first problem has to do with the two senses of "intellectual substance" in Strawson's analysis of the fatal error. If there is a person sense of terms such as "intellectual substance", isn't that powerful evidence that persons are not modes? If so, to maintain a mode interpretation of persons may require another account of the fatal error passage that does away with the person meaning of terms that imply that persons are substances.

The second problem is that Strawson claims that the continuity of the subject of experience is assumed while at the same time admitting that Locke stresses that "it isn't a function of the diachronic identity or continuity of his substantial realizers across time." So be it, but then how do we get "a sharply bounded set of actions and experiences with which we are to raise the question of John's Personal identity"? I think this takes us to the next problem.

The most puzzling and to me troubling aspect of Strawson's claims about persons as modes is his rejection of Locke's thought experiments. Picking up the account of John's personal identity quoted above, Strawson continues,

Thought-experiments involving cobblers and princes are one thing, reality is another, and in reality, when we ask which set of actions and experiences we must pick from, when we try to identify the set of actions and experiences John is Conscious of (and so responsible for, and so constituted as a Person by) it is, again, simply the complete set of actions and experiences of John the human subject of experience. (p. 122)

Clearly Strawson is uncomfortable with the Prince and the Cobbler thought experiment. Presumably this is because it is a case of body transfer -- the Prince's soul, having been transferred to the body of the cobbler, would still have its princely thoughts while being in the body of the cobbler. Does this mess up Strawson's picture of what Locke is doing? Strawson thinks so. I am guessing that the reason is that the prince as a Lockean person is supposed to be a mode of the prince as a human being -- just another aspect of that human being. But now the prince as person has been detached from the human being of which it is a mode and been transferred to another human being, and it still remembers all the actions and experiences of the prince. On Strawson's view, however, the cobbler should provide the set of actions and experiences by which the prince should be judged. But this is certainly not what Locke is saying. On Locke's view the Prince is conscious of none of the Cobbler's actions or experiences. It seems that Strawson is rejecting the puzzle cases and is implicitly giving up the claim that the substantial realizers of the subject of experience can change in order to maintain that we have a sharply bounded set of experiences that limit John's personal identity.

Strawson protests that Locke's theory is about actual people, and not these weird body-swapping cases. (p. 128) But Locke too is talking about actual people. The Prince and the Cobbler thought experiment is not a "puzzle case" as some commentators take it to be. Rather, it is supposed to show us what is going to happen on Locke's account to all actual people on the Day of Judgment. It cuts through all the puzzles about what being resurrected in "the same body" means by saying that persons and human beings are different kinds of things and it is being the same person that is important for divine justice, not being the same man. I think this shows that we need a different account from the one Strawson gives of what bounds the set of actions that determine personal identity for Locke.

Turning to concernment, Strawson, following Shechtman, claims that Locke always uses the phrase "extension of consciousness" and never says that memory connections constitute personal identity. It is true that he doesn't, but in II.xxvii.20 he does say, "suppose I lose all memory of parts of my life, beyond the possibility of recall." This section clearly links memory with consciousness and personal identity. I think this means that neo-Lockean views are not as mistaken as Strawson and Shechtman claim.

There is much of interest in this little book. Some mode interpretation of Locke's account of persons may well be the right one. Still, I think Strawson's rejection of Locke's thought experiments is a serious red flag that tells us that, at the least, this interpretation needs to be modified.