Locke's Philosophy of Language

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Ott, Walter, Locke's Philosophy of Language, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 168pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521831199.

Reviewed by David Soles, Wichita State University


In several places Locke claims that words immediately or primarily signify ideas in the mind of the user. Recent Locke scholarship has tended to treat such remarks as part of a theory of meaning: the meaning or significance of a word is the idea associated with the word; alternatively, meaningful use of a word requires having an idea or sense associated with it. With meaning given by the idea associated with the word, one can use it to refer to extra-mental things. I am able to use ’computer’ to refer to the thing upon which I am working because, in part, I have an idea of what counts as a computer.

Ott proffers a radically different reading of Locke. Central to his reading is the notion of an indicative sign, a sign “whose significate is of necessity unavailable to perception, and which serves as an indication of that significate” (19). Sweating, for example, is an indicative sign of pores in the skin. We cannot perceive the pores, but sweating is evidence, a sign, of their presence, for we could not sweat unless we had pores. On Ott’s interpretation, Locke’s thesis that words are signs of ideas makes no assertions about meaning or reference; rather, it claims that words are indicative signs of the presence of certain ideas in the mind of the speaker. Words are used to indicate to others what ideas are present in the mind of the speaker. Words are not used to communicate information about extra-mental objects, but merely to convey information about the contents of the speaker’s thought.

Ott explicitly commits himself to this interpretation in unequivocal terms, arguing that, for Locke, “words indicate ideas in the mind of the speaker” (4), “the purpose of speech is to reveal one’s mind to others” (33), “words serve as indicators or signals” of ideas (24), “words serve only to indicate ideas in the mind of the speaker, or to revive ideas in us” (26, my emphasis),”someone uttering ’x’ is indicating that she has ’x’ in mind” (27), “to understand speech is for the hearer… to take the words as indicative signs of ideas in the mind of the speaker (or mental acts) , and to be correct in so taking them” (28), “the purpose of speech is to reveal one’s mind to others” (33), “Locke requires us to infer on the basis of a sign (a word) what is happening in a speaker’s mind if we are to understand what is said” (130-1). Words can be said to signify things other than ideas “only in an attenuated sense….to say that ’x’ denominates x is just to say that someone uttering ’x’ is indicating that she has x in mind” (27).

On this view, when my wife excitedly exclaims “The puppy is digging in the asparagus bed”, her purpose is to indicate to me that she has an idea that the puppy is digging in the asparagus bed and successful communication will occur if and only if I judge that she has that idea. Since successful communication does not require acquiring beliefs about anything beyond the mentation of the speaker, I need make no further inferences about the state of the garden or puppy. The absurdity of such a view (which makes language learning, lying, misstatement of fact, etc. mysterious at best) hardly needs to be noted, and we should be very hesitant to attribute it to Locke.

Ott offers two lines of reasoning in support of this interpretation. Here is the first.

(i) Locke believes that extra-mental objects and their qualities “are necessarily hidden from us” (22).
(ii) Since objects and qualities are necessarily hidden from us, i.e., we never perceive them, we know of them only by inferring their existence from the ideas they cause in us.
(iii) Ideas of perception are indicative signs of their causes (19).
(iv) Locke says that words are signs of ideas.
(v) He must be using ’sign’ in the same sense when he says that words are signs and when he says that ideas are signs.
(vi) “Given this, the most natural interpretation of Locke’s claim that words are signs of ideas in the mind of the speaker is that words serve as indicators or signals of those ideas” (24).

While this argument is open to several criticisms (including questions about the plausibility of (v)), here I will focus on one which highlights a tendency in Ott’s book I find particularly worrisome. (i) through (iii) saddle Locke with a particularly vicious representative theory of perception (RTP) which holds that one never perceives extra-mental objects, that one perceives only ideas and that beliefs in the existence of extra-mental objects are the result of inferences from ideas to causes. Now Locke nowhere formulates or defends what could be called a theory of perception, and in those places where he most directly considers theories of perception, he attacks the RTP with devastating effectiveness. Furthermore, passages cited in support of attributing the RTP to Locke are typically taken from contexts where perception is not under consideration. Commentators over the past few decades have been increasingly reluctant to attribute the RTP, at least in this form, to Locke, and consensus seems to be forming around the view that Locke does not hold the RTP — at least not in a form which maintains that we do not perceive extra-mental objects. Since the assumption that Locke holds a strong version of the RTP is essential to Ott’s argument, some argument for the attribution would be appropriate; at the very least, it should be acknowledged that the assumption is highly controversial and that serious considerations against it can be adduced.

Ott’s second reason for attributing to Locke the thesis that words are indicative signs of ideas is based on what he calls Locke’s Main Argument. At 3.10.19. Locke discusses the proclivity of some to suppose that a general term refers to the real essence of a sort, and he argues that this supposition only involves us in difficulties because

by this tacit reference to the real essence of that Species of Bodies, the word Gold (which by standing for a more or less perfect Collection of simple Ideas, serves to design that sort of Body well enough in Civil Discourse) comes to have no signification at all, being put for somewhat, whereof we have no Idea at all, and so can signify nothing at all, when the Body it self is away.

Why, Ott asks, does Locke assert that if ’gold’ referred to or signified the real essence of a sort it could have no significance when a piece of gold was not present?

His answer maintains that Locke’s claim can make sense only if words are indicative signs. An indicative sign always indicates the presence of its significate: perspiration indicates pores in the skin because we can perspire only if we have pores in the skin, so whenever perspiration occurs pores are present. If words are indicative signs, then Locke’s claim that ’gold’ cannot refer to the real essence of gold in the absence of gold makes sense: as indicative signs, words are present only when their significates are present; as an indicative sign, an utterance of ’gold’ is always accompanied by its significate.

Once again, there is a host of problems here. First, in quoting this passage Ott omits Locke’s parenthetical remark about civil discourse which I include. In civil discourse (i.e., ordinary, non-philosophical discourse), ’gold’ serves well enough to “design” a particular sort of body. Note that in civil discourse ’gold’ designs a body — not the idea of a body — and here ’design’ must mean something like ’refer’. So it looks like there are some cases where words do design (refer to, designate, indicate) bodies. So much for the claim that the only use of words is to be indicative signs of ideas. Second, here Locke is concerned to rebut those who in philosophical discourse (which serves “to convey the precise Notions of Things, and to express in general Propositions, certain and undoubted Truths” (3.9.3)) assume that ’gold’ signifies the real essence of a sort or species, and there is a very simple reason why he thinks such an assumption would entail that ’gold’ would fail to signify in the absence of gold: there are not real essences of sorts. Therefore, if knowing the meaning of ’gold’ required knowledge of gold’s real essence, the term would be meaningless. At best, we could use it only ostensively to refer to the real essence of a thing present.

Not only do Ott’s two arguments fail to sustain his interpretation, the passages he quotes sometimes undermine it. Consider the following passage quoted from 3.10.7: “when a Man says Gold is malleable, he means and would insinuate more than this, that what I call Gold is malleable, (though truly it amounts to no more)” (90). For Locke, when one says that gold is malleable, one’s assertion amounts to the claim that those things one calls gold are malleable. The things called gold are malleable, not the ideas of gold.

Also, words cannot be indicative signs of ideas. Indicative signs, remember, indicate the presence of something imperceptible. Locke, however, repeatedly says that words can serve as signs or marks of our own ideas. He also claims that we can perceive our own ideas. In thought when one is silently discoursing to oneself, words cannot be used as indicative signs. Ott, perhaps, attempts to forestall this objection in passing when he suggests that the paradigm case of using words as signs or marks of ideas for ourselves is writing: “One might jot down words for her own use and come back to them later, so as to remind herself of what she had been thinking” (25). But this is a totally unmotivated gloss to put on Locke’s oft-repeated claim that we use words as signs of our own ideas in thinking.

Finally, there are arguments to the effect that the thesis that words signify ideas cannot be taken literally. This is not the place to review those arguments, but it should be noted that in addition to claiming that the use of words is to signify ideas, Locke also maintains that their use is to: convey thoughts (3.1.2), communicate thoughts (3.2.1), “express Thoughts and Imaginations” (3.2.6), “convey the Knowledge of Things (3.10.23), and “convey… Discoveries, Reasonings, and Knowledge (3.11.5). The thesis that words signify ideas must be understood in light of these passages which Locke takes to be either synonymous with the thesis or amplifications of it. When so interpreted, it is impossible to construe the thesis along Ott’s lines.

The claim that Locke’s words are indicative signs of ideas is qualified/relaxed somewhat in the discussion of particles and propositions. There it is argued that words also can be indicative signs of mental acts. Treating syncategormatic words such as ’and’, ’if’, ’but’, ’not’, etc. as indicative signs of the speaker’s mental acts is supposed to show that “Locke’s position has the resources to account for the unity of the proposition and propositional attitudes” (5). Ott is certainly correct here in noting both that Locke does claim that we use such words to signify certain mental acts or actions whereby ideas are related and that, consequently, the claim that words signify only ideas cannot be construed too narrowly. I was not aware, however, that Locke had a problem with accounting for either the unity of propositions or propositional attitudes, and the discussion here is motivated by “problems” raised by figures such as Mill, Russell, Wittgenstein and Geach who were not even addressing Locke’s views. The posing and resolution of “problems” which no Locke scholar would consider to be issues is another worrisome tendency of this work.

The discussion of Essence and Abstraction, delineates “three central problems that any defensible account of Lockean abstraction must be able to answer” (55).

(i) Locke says both that “abstraction consists in separating simple ideas from complex ones” and that “all ideas enter the senses simple and unmixed”. But if simple ideas enter the senses simple and unmixed, what need is there for separation?” (55)

(ii) Locke is committed to the following two theses: (a) in abstraction the mind makes nothing new but merely leaves out individuating detail, retaining only what is common to a number of particulars; (b) the senses afford us awareness only of fully determinate features. This generates the following problem. “How can a single idea range over a number of particulars, which might not share any determinate feature? An abstract idea of mankind that includes a fully determinate set of facial features…would be totally inadequate to representing every individual falling under the sortal term ’mankind’. So it seems the mind must in some sense “make something new”, insofar as the abstract idea must include determinable, not determinate features” (55). How can Locke “posit a process or method by which abstract ideas are created and at the same time hold that in creating such ideas the mind ’makes nothing new’“ (67).

(iii) “Locke claims that generality is only a relation ideas are placed in; intrinsically, nothing at all is general….But the claim that generality is a wholly extrinsic relation sits uneasily with other of Locke’s commitments” (55).

Beginning with (1). First, in addressing this issue, Ott digresses into a lengthy discussion of whether Locke’s account of abstraction implies that abstraction is merely selective attention or the actual separating of the abstracted idea. Ott rightly argues that it is separating. Unfortunately, he gives the impression that Locke scholars are nearly unanimous in opting for selective attention, a position “most commentators” are alleged to hold. Ayers, Mackie and Winkler are cited but there is no discussion of scholars, like Chappell, who defend a separation thesis. Third, the “problem” of (i) is generated by a particularly uncharitable reading of Locke. It can arise only for someone who takes the claim that ideas “enter by the senses simple and unmixed” to mean that what we perceive and all that we perceive, are simple, unmixed ideas. Ott does endorse this view when he claims that, for Locke, “only simple ideas are available in experience” that “sensation only provides simple ideas” (64). But a careful reading of 2.1.1 quickly undermines that interpretation. Using Locke’s examples, one feels at once the coldness and hardness of the ice. One does not have a perceptual experience of coldness and a separate perceptual experience of hardness. One can, however, abstract out the separate simple components of the unitary perceptual experience. One can, in thought, distinguish the idea of cold from the idea of hard and, noticing the similarity between the feeling of the ice and the lead pipe, form the abstract idea of hardness. The case is even clearer with ideas of vision. Locke does not believe that we can perceive the motion of an object without perceiving its color. These considerations, obviously, provide the answer to Ott’s question: what need is there for such separation?

“Problem” (ii) also is a non-problem. First, Locke repeatedly indicates that in creating abstract ideas the mind does make something new. Two sentences subsequent to the one Ott cites, Locke explicitly refers to the creation of the abstract idea of animal as the creation of a new idea, “Which new Idea, is made, not by any addition, but only, as before, by leaving out” certain properties. Locke’s claim that in abstraction the mind “makes nothing new” must be read in light of this passage that immediately follows it. His point is that the mind adds nothing new to the abstract idea of a sort, but instead retains only what is common to all the particulars. Had Ott’s quote been two sentences longer there would not have been a “problem” to address.

If I understand him correctly, the third problem arises this way. Locke says that generality is not intrinsic to any idea; generality is an extrinsic relation of an idea, a matter of it being able to represent many particulars. But the content of an abstract idea is something which was “present in the initial idea(s) from which it was generated….The generality, then, must have a foundation in the intrinsic character of the idea’s intentional object: if an idea represents dogs, its content must in some way “conform” to dogs” (57). But if the content conforms to dogs, then it must be general, so what are we to make of Locke’s claim that abstract ideas are only extrinsically general; that their generality is merely a function of their being used to represent many particulars?

If I have correctly identified the problem, it too is a non-problem. In saying that generality is not intrinsic to any idea, Locke is not denying that the content of an abstract idea is intrinsically general in a semantic or epistemic sense; intrinsically its content must conform to many particulars if it is to do its job. The point is an ontological one. As Locke tirelessly repeats, everything that exists is a particular being. But, if everything is particular, someone might raise the question, “since all things that exist are only particulars, how come we by general Terms, or where find we those general Natures they are supposed to stand for” (3.3.6)? When five sections later, after what he recognizes as a short digression, he says that “General and Universal, belong not to the real existence of things…universality belongs not to things themselves, which are all of them particular in their Existence”, Locke is returning to his thesis that ontologically, in its mode of existence, everything is a particular, although some things, words and ideas, can be general in their representational capacity. As the context makes clear, Locke is dismissing a view which holds that a general term like ’man’ refers directly to a substantial form or real essence present in all men. On that view the substantial form of man is intrinsically universal in that it is numerically one and the same form instantiated in all individual men. Furthermore, even if there were only one man in the universe, the substantial form would be intrinsically universal in that it is capable of existing in more than just that one individual. Locke has no patience with such a view and insists that, ontologically speaking, everything which exists is a particular, though some things, words and ideas, can be universal in their representational capacity.

Having argued for and developed his interpretation in the first four chapters, Ott “relaxes” the thesis as noted above to accommodate words like ’infinity’ or ’God’, considers the reception of Locke’s philosophy of language and makes some concluding remarks comparing Locke’s position to recent developments in philosophy of language. While these are important topics, Ott’s treatment of them, being based on his thesis that Locke takes words to be indicative signs, does little to advance our understanding of the issues.

Ott is certainly correct in seeing an intimate connection between Locke’s philosophy of language and his broader epistemological and metaphysical views, and the book is to be commended for emphasizing that Locke’s philosophy of language cannot be studied in isolation from his broader philosophical positions nor they independently of it. I fear, however, that his interpretation is unlikely to further our understanding of Locke. The interpretation ignores or elides passages which clearly undercut it, is based on highly implausible readings of certain passages, and presupposes, without argument or consideration of alternative views, highly controversial interpretations of other aspects of Locke’s philosophy.