Locke's Image of the World

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Michael Jacovides, Locke's Image of the World, Oxford University Press, 2017, 231 pp., $70 (hbk), ISBN 9780198789864.

Reviewed by Matthew Stuart, Bowdoin College


Michael Jacovides thinks that the best way to understand Locke's philosophy is to see it in relation to the science of his day. That is not a new idea, but Jacovides pursues it with erudition and panache in this illuminating and provocative book.


Nearly everyone agrees that we need to know something about the theories of Locke's scholastic predecessors, and of his friends and contemporaries Boyle and Newton, if we are to fully understand what he says, and why he says what he does, about perception, primary and secondary qualities, and real and nominal essences. In the last few decades, some have gone further, making the relation of physical theory to philosophical theory the main focus of their exegesis of Locke's Essay. An early example is Peter Alexander's Ideas, Qualities and Corpuscles. A more recent one is Peter Anstey's John Locke and Natural Philosophy. Jacovides mines the same vein, but in a way he goes even further in depicting philosophy and physical theory as intertwined for Locke. Jacovides presents the Essay as an object lesson in Kuhnian philosophy of science. It is not just that we must understand the corpuscularian milieu to understand Locke. Jacovides claims that the corpuscularian milieu shapes Locke's own experience of the world, making contingencies seem to him necessities, and keeping him from recognizing certain possibilities as possibilities.


Jacovides begins with a couple of chapters on Locke's views about method. He tells us how, in the early 1660s, Locke is exposed to the mechanical philosophy through his reading of Descartes and his friendship with Boyle, but also influenced by the Oxford physician Thomas Willis, who favored a more speculative approach to chemistry and biology (4-5). Later, Locke comes into the orbit of the London physician Thomas Sydenham, and together they grow increasingly skeptical about the project of offering explanations in natural philosophy (11-13). According to Jacovides, Locke thinks that if we were able to supply explanations in natural philosophy, these would show effects following from causes with something like mathematical necessity (17). If that seems hard to fathom, Jacovides says that it is because of the paradigm in which we ourselves work. Hume's arguments have affected our minds in such a way that "The inconceivability of cause without its effect" has become "inconceivable to us" (18).


Although Locke is skeptical about our ability to supply corpuscularian explanations, Jacovides says that there is a certain sense in which he finds any alternative to corpuscularianism inconceivable. His conviction that natural phenomena are produced by "impulsive mechanisms," though originally founded on empirical evidence, comes to seem to him self-evident (37). That is why Locke declares that impulse is "the only way which we can conceive Bodies operate in" (Essay, 2.8.11), a declaration he stands by even after he comes to accept that action at a distance is real.


By 1699, Locke concedes the fact of universal gravitation, though he still describes the manner of it as inconceivable to him. Jacovides asks how he "comes to abandon a commitment to a theory so strong that it hampers his ability to contemplate alternatives to it" (42). His answer is that social relations are an important part of the story. Though Locke does work hard to understand the Principia, other factors -- the testimony of Huygens (43), friendship with Newton (44), Newton's standing in late 17th-century England (44), and Newton's Britishness (45) -- are involved in persuading Locke to accept universal gravitation. This is one place where, according to Jacovides, the arguments take Locke only so far and we must look to other factors to explain his ending up where he does. Some may see this as uncharitable, or may point out that speculations about unconscious psychological mechanisms are bound to be inconclusive. In Jacovides's defense, it should be said that he works hard to find Lockean arguments before resorting to psychological speculation, and that he marshals a good deal of historical and biographical evidence to support his speculations.


Jacovides's book is more than an exercise in Kuhnian philosophy of science. He offers solutions to many well-known exegetical puzzles, including those about Locke's attitude toward the idea of substance, his claim that our minds are likely immaterial, his conception of ideas, and his assertion that some ideas resemble qualities in bodies. I find all of what Jacovides has to say on these matters interesting, even if I do not find it all convincing.


Locke's remarks about the idea of substance have puzzled readers from his day to ours. He says that the idea of substance is the "first and chief" constituent of the idea of any distinct particular thing (Essay, 2.12.6), and he seems to treat it as an indispensable part of our conceptual repertoire. On the other hand, he says many disparaging things about our idea of substance, calling it obscure and confused (Essay, 2.23.3), and sometimes even suggesting that we do not have it (Essay, 2.31.13). For the most part, Jacovides limits his attention to two readings, one that he disparages and one that he favors. On the reading he disparages, the idea of substance is that of a bare particular, a "funny" (56) or "strange" (58) kind of thing that is a "perplexing metaphysical part" of such ordinary objects as organisms and chemical stuffs (55). On the reading he favors, substances are ordinary objects (55), and what Locke calls "the idea of substance in general" (Essay, 2.23.3) is meant as a kind of place holder, a stand-in for more informative ideas of body and spirit, respectively (56). Locke's complaints about the obscurity and confusion of our idea of corporeal substance are simply complaints about our ignorance of the deepest facts about matter, facts that would explain why bodies cohere and how they communicate motion one to another (61).


The reading that Jacovides disparages is one that many commentators have been reluctant to embrace, even if there are times where Locke's words seem to point us in that direction. By selecting that reading as the main foil to his own, Jacovides makes his job a bit easier than perhaps it should be. It is also worth noting that few commentators would deny that ordinary objects are Lockean substances. All agree that he applies the term 'substance' to men and horses, to the sun, and to such stuffs as lead and gold. The question is whether he also sometimes uses it in a different way, to refer to something more mysterious or problematic. We do not settle that question by citing the places where Locke calls organisms and metals substances, or by noting his claim that he has not discarded substance from the reasonable part of the world.


Locke says that our idea of an individual horse or stone includes the ideas of its sensible qualities, but that because we cannot conceive how sensible qualities "should subsist alone, nor in one another, we suppose them existing in, and supported by some common subject; which Support we denote by the name Substance" (Essay, 2.23.4). On Jacovides's reading, what is denoted by the name 'substance' is just the horse or stone. What of the relation of inherence, the relation of "existing in" or being "supported by"? Often Jacovides writes as though sensible qualities inhering in a horse is just a matter of the horse's having the qualities. Yet when Locke complains that nobody has any idea of substance beyond "a Supposition of he knows not what support of such Qualities" (Essay, 2.23.2), Jacovides takes him to be complaining about our ignorance of what causes or explains the horse's sensible qualities (107). I worry that Jacovides slides back and forth between treating inherence as a logical or ontological relation and treating it as a causal relation. Another worry is that on Jacovides's reading, it is the horse that "he knows not." Surely some of us know a lot about horses, and most have ideas of them going beyond mere supposition? Jacovides says that in passages like that one, Locke is using 'know' in a "technical sense," one on which knowing involves fully understanding a thing's foundations (61). That would solve the problem, but strikes me as ad hoc.


According to Locke, one of the things that we don't know about substance is whether God can make corporeal substances think. Yet he assures us that probably, in each of us, "consciousness is annexed to, and the Affection of one individual immaterial Substance" (Essay, 2.27.25). He seems to offer no justification for thinking so, and you might suspect that he is simply putting his thumb on the scale to placate religious orthodoxy. Jacovides argues that this is unlikely. He points out that Locke is willing to question the biblical credentials of the doctrine of the Trinity at a time when denying the Trinity was a crime (132). Jacovides notes that in the correspondence with Stillingfleet, Locke cites a passage from the Essay (4.10.16) as lending support for a dualist account of ourselves (131). Some commentators dismiss the reference as a non sequitur, but Jacovides works to make sense of it. The passage is one in which Locke argues that God cannot be material because the mere juxtaposition of material parts could not account for His wisdom and knowledge. Jacovides argues that Locke leans toward a dualist account of ourselves because he thinks that a corporeal substance could not be guided by principles of rationality if it is governed by the principles of mechanics (133). How matter might be conscious is a conundrum, but how matter might be rational is a deeper conundrum.


In three chapters toward the end of the book, Jacovides tackles the questions that he identifies as his primary concern, questions about Locke's treatment of sensible qualities and our cognition of them. Like most philosophers who write about perception, Locke focuses his attention on vision. He thinks that to have a visual experience is, in the first instance, to have ideas of a certain sort, ideas that represent the things we seem to see. Jacovides devotes a chapter to Locke's views about the nature of visual ideas, and to the relation of these views to developments in painting and in optics. He devotes another chapter to understanding Locke's claim that some ideas of sensible qualities resemble the qualities they represent, a notion he finds to be rooted in scholastic theories of perception. A third chapter deals with Locke's views about the meanings of the words we use to talk about sensible qualities.


Locke holds that judgment alters the ideas that sensation delivers. Though we judge a globe to be spherical, the idea that it imprints on the mind "is of a flat Circle variously shadow'd" (Essay, 2.9.8). Jacovides takes this to mean that what the globe looks like is not a three-dimensional object, but a two-dimensional array (136). He offers a limited defense of Locke on this point. He suggests that it is only when Locke sits down to do epistemology that things look two-dimensional to him (147), and that we too can see what is before us as a two-dimensional array of color patches (146). What about these ideas or color patches? Jacovides compares them to Anscombian intentional objects -- objects of perception that are as they seem to be (145). He also says that it helps to think of Locke's visual ideas as mental images, and explains that by a mental image he means "an intentional object that can be drawn on a piece of paper" (163). Other readers may find these characterizations more helpful than I do. I am not sure that I can see anything as an array of color patches, and I find myself drawn to deflationary accounts of intentional objects and mental images.


Whatever Locke's sensory ideas are, we must try to make sense of his claims that the ones representing primary qualities resemble those qualities, whereas the ones representing secondary qualities resemble nothing in bodies (Essay, 2.8.15). It is the claim about ideas of primary qualities that is the showstopper. Many commentators look for a non-literal reading of it, but not Jacovides. He says that our task is to "recapture our pre-Berkeleyan innocence from a time when people could make sense of ideas resembling things besides ideas" (151). He portrays Locke as rejecting scholastic theories of light and matter, but as retaining the scholastic view that physical qualities can be present in perceivers in a distinctive, mental way, and also the view that resembling representations are especially informative (152). If you cannot get your mind around mental items resembling physical ones, Jacovides says, the conclusion to draw is that "the boundaries of conceivability can be relative to social circumstances, and that this is as true for historians of philosophy as it is for the figures they study" (159).


Jacovides presents Locke as offering a semantics for secondary quality terms, an analysis designed to preserve ordinary ways of talking in the face of the revisions forced on us by science. Because corpuscularian science teaches that nothing in bodies resembles our ideas of colors, it suggests the threatening result that we are wrong when we say that apples are red. Jacovides sees Locke as responding with the suggestion that 'redness' denotes an idea, and that when apples are called "red" they are so called derivatively because they trigger the idea that 'redness' denotes (183). You might think that in distinguishing between primary and secondary qualities, Locke is distinguishing two kinds of features that bodies possess -- intrinsic and non-dispositional on the one hand, and extrinsic and dispositional on the other. Jacovides argues that he is up to something more radical. He sees Locke as denying that secondary qualities are "real beings" in the way that primary qualities are (192). He sees him as trying to show that "we don't have to posit secondary qualities existing as entities in bodies in order to explain how our secondary quality predicates operate" (193).


Though this book draws on ten articles that Jacovides published over a decade and a half, it does not read like a collection of papers strung together. It is exceptionally well written, and supplies a coherent narrative from a consistent point of view. Jacovides is sympathetic without being uncritical; and whether defending Locke or criticizing him, he puts all of his cards on the table. This is a valuable addition to the literature on Locke, not least because Jacovides makes such an effort to see things as Locke might have seen them, and to get us to do that too.