Logic from Kant to Russell: Laying the Foundations for Analytic Philosophy

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Sandra Lapointe (ed.), Logic from Kant to Russell: Laying the Foundations for Analytic Philosophy, Routledge, 2019, 255pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780815396321.

Reviewed by James Pearson, Bridgewater State University


If students in a first logic course ask about the subject's history -- whether driven by curiosity or perhaps hoping for a breather -- they are often rewarded with a history of heroes. In the distant past strides mighty Aristotle, whose syllogistic forms provided scholars a structure for clear argumentation. Then a jump to tragic Frege, whose innovations went largely ignored and whose calculus was proven contradictory. But then, a twist! Plucky young Russell who discovered this flaw also carried forward Frege's dream of trying to construct a logical foundation for mathematics.

All this makes for a good story. But it is, to say the least, incomplete. One might encourage advanced students to explore other figures, depending upon their interests: medieval logic (Boethius, Avicenna, Al-Razi, Buridan); logic in analytic philosophy (Wittgenstein, Tarski, Quine, Kripke); mathematics and logic (Boole, Peano, Cantor); or philosophy of mathematics (Hilbert, Heyting, Gödel). This volume of eleven new essays instead concerns the comparatively neglected area of 19th century logic, particularly the part "Kant's theories and the theories that drew on Kant [played in logic's] development" (12). As a result, readers will encounter (many) more than the usual suspects, including Hegel, Herbart, Bolzano, Lotze, Hamilton, Sigwart, Cohen, Moore -- and, of course, Kant.

The volume also evinces the field's growing interest in historiography. In deliberately omitting chapters dedicated to Frege or Russell it seeks to draw focus from the canonical greats (25), but more than that, it aims to demonstrate the value of telling logic's history without canonizing heroes at all, offering a disciplinary history of logic in the pre-analytic period that refuses whiggish rational reconstruction in favor of an antiquarian examination of the grubby details. At its worst, antiquarian history -- and perhaps especially antiquarian history of philosophy -- presents recondite minutiae that are of limited interest. Such labor may seem indulgent if subsequent philosophical research has rendered previously pressing problems moot (a perennially tempting objection for those naturalist philosophers who look enviously at working scientists under no pressure to study the history of their field). Yet at its best, reading antiquarian history can be generative. If we find ourselves unable to fill the gaps it reveals between what happened and what we have learned to tell ourselves happened, we have reason to revisit our foundational myths and ensure that they do not entrench a pernicious false narrative.

What is pernicious about the heroic Aristotle-Frege-Russell (and perhaps select others) narrative? The answer Sandra Lapointe gives in her introduction is that our canonical history of logic is not only inaccurate but motivated by "self-congratulations" (24). "Past philosophers," she tells us, are "members of overlapping epistemic communities," rather than isolated geniuses (24). So long as we emphasize "great minds" in the histories of logic we tell, we promulgate the misconception that some people are "just good" at mathematics and logic, and honor ourselves by claiming a position as their inheritors. But no, according to Lapointe, each step of mathematical and logical development required collaboration, correction, and hard work.

The essays comprising this volume successfully present the subtle tugs-of-war occupying the range of thinkers operating within the 19th century logical milieu. An author index is included (though, sadly, not a subject one). If some of the contributions are haunted by the specter of bad antiquarianism -- chronicling shifts in terminological vocabulary or the confusions of weak logicians without providing much in the way of critical commentary -- on the whole they are valuable. Lapointe's opening chapter supplies the book with a coherence that is too-often missing in volumes of collected essays. She has arranged the chapters in a roughly chronological order but additionally highlights five thematic threads for readers to trace: Kant's impact on logic, novel 19th century logical systems, 19th century anticipations of later logical developments, significant counterpoints to logical orthodoxy, and the context in which Russell's views developed. In this review, however, I want to emphasize three somewhat different threads that I hope will showcase some the volume's major lessons.

The first is that the influence of Kant's conception of logic has yet to be properly understood. Lapointe observes the disparity between 19th and 20th century assessments of the historical significance of Kant for logic. As late as 1912, Windelband wrote it was "well known" that Kant had "entirely changed" the development of logic, but by the 1960s the Kneales would argue that the majority of logical works from the middle of the fifteenth to the middle of the nineteenth century were mere textbooks of no philosophical interest, a view that is still commonly held today (7). What explains this shift in critical reception? Lapointe's answer appeals once more to historiography. The method of rational reconstruction pursued by the Kneales and other 20th century historians of logic involves looking to the past for insights about one's own moment, and there is admittedly little in Kant that is significant for the mathematical logic that dominated the 20th century. Yet Lapointe objects that it is anachronistic to expect a tight relationship between logic and the foundations of mathematics in Kant. Once we remove this structuring assumption, we can recover the sense in which 19th century historians of logic thought Kant important. His metaepistemological framework, Lapointe argues, was "immediately embraced by an astounding number of his successors" (18), allowing them to articulate the distinctions between studying the form of thinking (formal logic), the possibility of a priori cognition (transcendental logic), the empirical science of thinking (applied general logic), and the rules governing the various special sciences (special applied logic).

Although in the Critique Kant claimed that formal logic "seems to all appearance to be finished and complete" (Bviii, quoted 28), in his chapter on the Kantian school of logic Jeremy Heis examines disputes between Kant's immediate successors. Heis details how they sought clarity on four points: the relation between analyticity and formal logic, the nature of logical laws and their interrelation, the meaning of calling logic "formal," and the nature of concept formation. Rather than adjudicating their disputes or assessing the philosophical value of their solutions, however, Heis's aim is to convince his reader that there was space for interesting disagreement about logic in Kant's wake, and that, far from producing and reproducing textbooks, the Kantian school of logic was both critical and active. He achieves both of these aims, and this well-organized and researched chapter will be an important source for future scholarship in this area.

Whereas Heis examines Kant's influence on a group of logicians, a number of other chapters assess his influence on a single thinker. Lydia Patton takes on Boole, arguing that Boole intended his innovative algebraic logic to secure a sense in which the laws of logic are necessary laws of thought, and that he is thus best understood as part of (rather than opposed to) the British post-Kantian "New Analytic" school. Frederick Beiser demystifies Cohen, whose defense of Kant from Hegelian attack seems to cede the crucial ground to Hegel by repudiating the hard-fought Kantian dualisms between both understanding and sensibility and concept and existence. According to Beiser, the key to understanding Cohen is to be found in his earlier interpretation of Leibniz, whose conception of the infinitesimal struck Cohen as showing how qualitative experience could be reduced to quantitative experience. Beiser develops a compelling reading whereby Cohen radicalizes rather than undermines Kant, reckoning a priori knowledge not merely the province of mathematics but of all knowledge. Nicholas Griffin entertainingly relates his surprise at finding that the arch-formalist Hilbert includes an epigraph from Kant in his Foundations of Geometry ("is it the kind of ritual homage that led Soviet scholars in the 1930s to have epigraphs from Stalin, or North American English professors in the 1980s to acknowledge their debt to Derrida?" (236)) before building an argument that (prior to his turn to logicism) it is Russell's treatment of geometry that is truer to the tenets of mathematical formalism (and so that should be regarded as properly anti-Kantian), avoiding as it does any appeal to intuition. And Graham Priest reads Hegel as a dialetheist who was bravely willing to take the plunge into paraconsistency that Kant ought to have taken upon discovering the antinomies. Readers' interest in these chapters will in part depend upon their interest in the figure being discussed (and, in at least Priest's case, on the philosophical program of their author), but I particularly recommend taking a look at Beiser's deft and concise exploration.

The second major lesson of this volume is the extent to which what it means to study "logic" shifted during the 19th century. To read a past thinker "in context" is a matter not just of learning about their intellectual situatedness but also what they understood by their words. While many of us are primed to treat words like "objectivity" and "experience" gingerly in the mouths of our philosophical forbears, "logic" might be thought relatively stable. Yet this collection demonstrates how mistaken this assumption would be by bringing out just how different some 19th century conceptions of logic were to our own.

Consuelo Preti motivates her examination of British philosophy with a puzzle: when Russell approvingly discussed Moore's 1898 dissertation on Kant and the nature of judgment, why did he describe Moore as a logician? During this period, she argues, "the expressions 'logic,' 'psychology,' and 'metaphysics' could mean just about anything depending on who employed them; what country they were in; what interests they had; how little they took account of other thinkers' work; and how confused they were accused of being" (192). Sifting through this morass, she ultimately concludes that Russell's appellation is best explained by the Cantabrigian reception of Kant qua philosopher interested in the nature of understanding as a logician, whose theory of judgment Russell took Moore to have successfully critiqued.

Clinton Tolley adopts a similar framework, asking how Hegel can have possibly thought that logic contained ethics, or that theology and logic share subject matter. His answer is that Hegel was building upon Kant's conception of logic as the science of thinking. To be capable of achieving this end, Hegel judged, logic would have to explain our capacity for thinking about the highest things we can think about -- namely, God. After carefully tracing the evolving relationship between thinking and objectivity found before Kant, in Kant, before Hegel, and finally in Hegel, Tolley concludes by helpfully contrasting Hegel's expansive conception of logic with more recent mathematical-objectivist, semantic-objectivist, and pragmatic-intersubjectivist ones. While not holding logic to be a matter of individual psychology, Hegel's conception ties logic to the subjective activity of thinking (like the semantic-objectivist and pragmatic-intersubjectivist), yet also takes logical laws to govern absolutely everything (like the mathematical-objectivist) rather than just meanings or practices. Unlike all three, however, Hegel attributes causality to thinking (and so also to logic), in that thinking is "part of what produces and thereby 'rules' the world" (98).

Sean Morris provides a careful and persuasive explanation of why Russell praised Sigwart (who was, strike one, a theist, and, strike two, a psychologist logician) by attending to the role of methodology in Sigwart's writings on logic. Like Heis, Morris cautiously announces that his chapter is offering a historical exploration rather than philosophical critique, but it should be thought no less important for that qualifier. By articulating key aspects of Sigwart's approach (such as his adoption of a scientific starting point rather than a Cartesian position of doubt, his advocation of collaboration on philosophical problems rather than praise for individual speculative metaphysics, and his view of the search for logical axioms as an inductive activity), Morris makes the case that Russell was impressed by Sigwart's proto-naturalism, and that, like him, Russell sought to systematize the sciences by determining which among them offers the highest degree of certainty. It is particularly interesting to read that Sigwart viewed the unity of the sciences as a hypothesis requiring confirmation rather than a program to be completed, as it would subsequently become in the movement led by Carnap, Neurath, and Charles Morris.

The final value of this volume that I wish to highlight is establishing that Frege's views did not emerge ex nihilo. Ever since the famous confrontation between Dummett and Sluga, the influence of philosophers and mathematicians upon Frege has been a matter of scholarly debate. A number of these papers fuel Sluga's contention that various insights we credit to Frege had been anticipated by others, or existed in nascent form in their work. Lapointe, for instance, champions Bolzano as an unjustly neglected innovator, arguing that we are positioned to appreciate "the magnitude of Bolzano's proposed change" if we properly grasp the Kantian school of logic to which he was responding (105). Decompositional analysis and the theory of deduction were intimately connected for the Kantians, meaning that Bolzano's critique of the first necessitated significant work on the second. Although his assessment of concepts in terms of substitutability rather than containment is relatively well known, achieving as it does a broader way of applying the analytic/synthetic distinction to judgments than the Kantian approach, Lapointe details the novelty of Bolzano's logic. Bolzano employed two notions of deduction, one (deducibility) corresponding to what we would call truth preservation, and a second (ground-consequence) capturing the necessity of this process. Among the interesting effects of this separation (that we are now used to bringing together in our contemporary conception of logical consequence) is that, for Bolzano, nothing (rather than everything) is deducible from a contradiction, and logic becomes non-monotonic. She closes by amplifying her introductory historiographical remarks. Despite the tendency of some recent scholars, superficial pronouncements such as that Kripke's views were shaped by Russell and Wittgenstein are merely "part of an attempt to position oneself in some putatively worthy lineage" (118), and although Frege's logic is the more familiar, it is unjust to quickly dismiss Bolzano's as anti-Kantian, and unworthy of further study.

Nicholas F. Stang's chapter can be read in a similar vein. One of the richest debates in recent Frege scholarship concerns Frege's apparent commitment to Platonism. Frege's declaration that we must recognize a "third realm" beyond the material and the mental in order to account for the intersubjective thoughts that are the proper object of logical inquiry has been read by many as straightforwardly ontologically Platonist, and by most of those readers as metaphysically suspect. Yet an alternative deflationary reading presented by Thomas Ricketts and Erich Reck maintains that Frege's remarks are best understood as part of his explanation of the capacity for judgment, a reading which roots his conception of logic in our manifest practices rather than speculative metaphysics. Determining which view is best attributed to Frege has generated increasingly sophisticated commentaries on his corpus. But Stang argues that whatever Frege may have meant by referencing a third realm, there is considerable evidence that Lotze had the conception of logic which Ricketts and Reck attribute to Frege. Deflationary Platonism about logic mutes a range of skeptical challenges and remains an exceptionally interesting position in its own right, and Stang's chapter demonstrates that scholars wishing to study it further have reason to broaden their historical knowledge beyond Frege to Lotze.

Reck dedicates his own chapter to Dedekind who was a more famous logicist than Frege during his lifetime. Determining how Frege's and Dedekind's quite different approaches could both count as logicist, Reck argues, reveals that the boundaries of logic were broader (if somewhat inchoate) in the 19th century. Both Frege's and Dedekind's logicisms involved an introduction to what we would now call set theory, but Frege created and deployed a powerful formal calculus in which mathematical truths could be deduced, whereas Dedekind's procedure for securing the foundation of arithmetic relied upon set theoretic abstraction and construction. Although neither mathematician specified what makes a truth logical, Reck draws out various similarities in their conceptions of logic (such as that logic must govern all other reasoning). He closes by calling for further clarification of the notion of logic with which both Frege and Dedekind were working.

In sum, this volume is a testament to the fertility of taking the work of 19th century logicians seriously. While not too technical for an advanced undergraduate, those who stand to benefit most from its varied insights into historiography and the pre-analytic period are at the graduate level and beyond.