Logic, Theology, and Poetry in Boethius, Abelard, and Alan of Lille: Words in the Absence of Things

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Eileen Sweeney, Logic, Theology, and Poetry in Boethius, Abelard, and Alan of Lille: Words in the Absence of Things, Palgrave Macmillan, 2006, 229pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 1403969728.

Reviewed by John Marenbon, Trinity College, Cambridge


Eileen Sweeney's new book makes an unexpected link between three medieval thinkers: Boethius, who wrote at the beginning of the sixth century, and Abelard and Alan of Lille, who both worked in the twelfth century. The connection between Boethius and Alan is an obvious one, since Alan's very widely-read prosimetrum, De planctu Naturae ('The Lament of Nature'), is self-consciously modelled in structure, and by antithesis in theme, on Boethius's De consolatione Philosophiae ('The Consolation of Philosophy'). But Abelard is, more usually, either placed with the logicians of his time, or seen, by historians from a different background, primarily as the author of his letters to Heloise. The case for considering him alongside Boethius and Alan emerges as a result of Sweeney's general approach.

This approach consists in discussing almost the entire, wide range of each author's work, without allowing herself to be limited by modern disciplinary boundaries: she is at once philosopher, historian, theologian and (in a way that proves to some extent her undoing) literary critic. So, in the section on Boethius, she moves from a treatment of his logical commentaries, to consider his opuscula sacra, the short treatises on theological disputes of the time, and only in the second half of her chapter does she come to the Consolation. In the case of Abelard, again she starts with his logical commentaries, before considering the different versions of his Theologia, his Ethics, his letters, the monastic rule he wrote for Heloise and his planctus, a series of highly-wrought poetic laments on Old Testament themes. Similarly, she avoids a narrow concentration on the two works of Alan's that have commanded most medievalists' attention -- the De planctu and the allegorical epic poem, Anticlaudianus -- and also looks in detail at three of his more strictly theological compositions: the Regulae caelestis iuris ('Rules of Theology'), where an attempt is made to construct an axiomatic theology; the Summa quoniam homines, Alan's highly logical exploration of the doctrinal issues of his time; and a book about theological language, the Liber in distinctionibus dictionum theologicalium ('Book of Distinctions in Theological Speech'). This breadth of approach helps to justify the collocation of the three authors, because it rapidly becomes apparent that all three share an unusual range in the intellectual areas they consider: they are each at once logicians, theologians and literary writers, of poetry as well as prose.

Within the individual examinations of Boethius, Abelard and Alan, Sweeney gives many valuable suggestions and analyses. I will focus on two. The end of Boethius's Consolation presents a puzzle to interpreters. The most obvious way of reading the text is to take Boethius as having been successfully consoled by the personification of Philosophy: he now sees that the world is governed justly in accord with the highest good, that the wicked do not really prosper and the virtuous are always rewarded; he is ready to raise the difficult question of whether divine prescience precludes contingency in human affairs, and to accept Philosophy's explanation of why it does not. Yet there are definite tensions within the text that tell against this straightforward interpretation, and there is the overarching problem of why Boethius, a Christian facing his death, limits himself to a purely philosophical consolation. Earlier scholars speculated, unconvincingly, that Boethius had abandoned Christianity for pagan Platonism. Recently, the tendency has been to ask, rather, whether Boethius is really aiming to present a successful philosophical consolation. Joel Relihan, for example, contends that the need for a Christian consolation is made clear because of Philosophy's failure. I have argued, more modestly, that Philosophy's overall argument is not coherent, and that, in her own, pagan terms, the personification of Philosophy is aware of her own limitations -- the limitations, that is, of human reasoning even raised to the highest level. Sweeney sees the matter a little differently (pp. 58-61). The inconsistency in Philosophy's arguments is a matter of pedagogy, 'moving her pupil ahead and, at times, coming back down to meet him when he cannot quite move higher with her.' In her view, Boethius the author is fully aware of the limitations of 'reason, Philosophy's instrument' in grasping the divine order, and it is here, she says, that the poetry of the Consolation -- which is, therefore, far more than ornamental -- has its role. This is a subtle reading, which carries a good deal of conviction.

Alan of Lille is seen by most historians as both an extreme representative of the systematic theology of the later twelfth century and, as a writer of an allegorical poem and prosimetrum, a figure linked to the current of twelfth-century humanism often associated with the ill-defined School of Chartres. Yet writers have also noticed the conservatism of many of Alan's theological positions, and they have struggled to reconcile them with his bold use of theological and poetic forms. Sweeney offers an overall view of Alan in which these disparate elements are harmonized. Alan, she believes, was deeply convinced of the gap between human language and things divine. Although his Regulae derive from Gilbert of Poitiers's attempt to see the proportionality between the language of science and that of theology, they aim to undercut any such attempt to gain a partial understanding of God in human terms. The verbal trickery in De planctu Naturae is seen as self-conscious and, to an extent, self-parodic: the effect, she urges, is to undercut the figure of Nature's claims to authority, which resides solely with supernatural theology. Whether so austerely doctrinal a view of Alan does justice to all his varied thinking and writing remains open to question, but Sweeney has certainly given a plausible way of understanding this prolific, influential but in many ways still mysterious writer.

Not all of what Sweeney writes is so convincing. Although she avoids outright mistakes, parts of her discussions of logic suggest that she has not always studied the problems in depth. The single page she dedicates to the complex answer to the problem of universals in Boethius's second Isagoge commentary conveys little of the issues at stake or of Boethius's argument: a comment like 'Words are not identical with the things they name, yet it is not false to call an individual by the universal name' (p. 11) is unhelpful -- words are identical with what they name only in the unusual case of when they name themselves, and the idea that there is a 'universal name' which might be quite different from that of the particulars of that kind is strange. Her account of Abelard's semantics is far fuller and more careful, and she is right to draw attention to the complexity of the theory and (p. 71) to the limitations Abelard places on human knowledge of forms. But she does not, in my view, give sufficient weight to the role of imposition within Abelard's theory. Arguably, Abelard distinguishes between the power of words, through imposition, to refer to members of a given natural kind, and the impositor's (and the speakers' and listeners') knowledge of the true nature of the things. In this way, he is able both to hold that, despite the changes and limitations of human knowledge of the world, our language does latch on to the world and its categorizations.

This reservation is of some importance in assessing the success of Sweeney's book as a whole. Sweeney wants to argue, about Abelard's logic, that he stresses 'the difference between the orders of words and things' (p. 71), that 'all language and all ways of conceiving things are incomplete' (p. 73). She can therefore conclude that 'For Abelard, words, divine and human understanding, sense perceptions, images, and things themselves are simply of different and nontransitive orders' (p. 79). In this way, Abelard is made to fit into Sweeney's overall thesis: that all three authors are concerned, though in different ways, to point out the gap between human conceptions and language, on the one hand, and God, on the other. Boethius, she believes, is aware of the distance between the human and divine, but tries, through slow and steady progress, to overcome it; Abelard, rather, is concerned to point out 'the non-identity of word and object, mind and world, and his theologies make a point of distinguishing between the truth, which is God's to tell, and the "verisimilitude" he can offer' (p. 180); Alan, in his turn, brings us 'all the way to God' but shows us 'the infinite abyss that separates us from God' (p. 182).

There are, however, two objections to this view. The first is that, whereas Sweeney's general thesis may illuminate Boethius's Consolation and the theology and poetry of Alan of Lille, it offers a very implausible way of viewing Abelard, who so clearly thought that he could explore areas of knowledge about God (the nature of the Trinity; attributes such as omnipotence and omniscience) that had been left unopened by earlier theologians and who, by praising the wisdom of the ancient, pre-Christian philosophers, stressed the extent to which even divine things are accessible to human reason. At the basis of Abelard's metaphysics is the assumption that we unproblematically grasp things according to the general and specific categories to which they really belong; and in ethics he makes a parallel assumption, that any sane adult naturally grasps the precepts of natural law. These are not the positions which would be taken by a thinker struck by 'the non-identity of word and object, mind and world.' Although Sweeney is right to see that as a philosopher with a literary sensibility, Abelard can be looked at alongside Boethius and Alan, she is mistaken in trying to assimilate his work more closely with theirs in its general aims.

The second objection is the more serious. To place, as Sweeney does, all or many of the works of all three chosen authors under a single, simple interpretative banner is ill-advised, both philosophically and historically. Philosophy (and philosophically-inclined theology) makes discreet, explicit arguments, which need to be understood and assessed, not subsumed beneath a supposed general position. Moreover, the study of logic had its own rationale and momentum; to read into it a Christian programme derived from an author's non-logical (and often later) work is misleading. Sweeney's laudable breadth of interest is compromised by this approach to interpretation, unfortunately common in literary criticism, in which the reader is encouraged to replace the complex understanding of a text with a convenient tag for the right intellectual pigeon-hole. She has written a thought-provoking book, but it would have been a better one had she shown more respect for the structure of the authors' own arguments, the different intellectual settings in which the various parts of their work can best be understood, and their grasp of a complexity in the problems they faced that cannot be encompassed by any single, pious solution.