Logical Empiricism in North America: Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, XVIII

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Gary L. Hardcastle and Alan W. Richardson, eds., Logical Empiricism in North America: Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, XVIII, Minneapolis, 2003, 293pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0816642214.

Reviewed by Thomas Nickles, University of Nevada, Reno


This thought-provoking volume studies the migration of logical empiricism (LE) from Vienna, Berlin, and Prague to the United States; the relations of logical empiricism to American pragmatism; and the surprising amount of disunity among logical empiricists (LEs) both before and after their emigration. The editors and some of the authors attempt to answer the question what contribution serious historical study of the origins of philosophy of science could make to refashioning philosophy of science as a discipline. Several chapters also contribute to the current rehabilitation of Otto Neurath.

The book is a sequel to Origins of Logical Empiricism (Minnesota Studies, XVI), edited by Ronald Giere and Richardson, 1996. These two volumes give the Minnesota Center a strong presence in the field of history of philosophy of science and present a good sample of recent work on the history of logical empiricism. Several leaders of the historical movement are represented in both volumes, including Michael Friedman, who is responsible for stimulating serious interest in the history of logical empiricism, at least on the American side of the Atlantic, and Don Howard and Alan Richardson, who organized the History of Philosophy of Science (HOPOS) Working Group some years ago.

The present volume contains eleven papers, preceded by the editors’ introduction in which Hardcastle and Richardson deplore the (in their view) moribund state of philosophy of science today and its loss of intellectual prestige among the disciplines. Between about 1930 and 1960, the logical positivists (as Herbert Feigl named them) or logical empiricists (now the preferred label for the members of both the Vienna Circle and the Berlin Society for Empirical Philosophy) were widely consulted experts on the nature of science and the founders of the formal-language branch of linguistic philosophy. Philosophy of science was an even more exciting and visible discipline during the 1960s and ’70s when LE rapidly fell to the new-wave philosophies of N. R. Hanson, Thomas Kuhn, Paul Feyerabend, Stephen Toulmin, Imre Lakatos, and Larry Laudan during “the battle of the big systems.” But no new paradigm emerged to fill the vacuum, and in our so-called postmodern era many think it undesirable to search for a unifying framework. Today “science studies” (history, sociology, anthropology, psychology, economics, and cultural studies of science, often to the exclusion of philosophy of science) is the more visible area, and philosophers of science are often portrayed as conservative heavies, with “positivism” a pejorative term. That the LEs themselves were very far from conservative during their European phase is well documented by the two Minnesota volumes. One of the functions of the historical movement is to debunk such myths and misperceptions.

In fact, its radical social program was one of LE’s primary reasons for being. Today, by contrast (say some of the authors), it is not clear what is at stake in technical philosophy of science. It seems to have no mission beyond the professional goals of a small academic discipline. It no longer engages wider issues or a lay intelligentsia. What to do about this situation? The editors see genuinely scholarly attention to the history of 20th-century philosophy of science as a promising route to a better future. Indeed, Hardcastle and Richardson rewrite the famous opening sentence of Thomas Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962) as their own call to action:

The history of philosophy of science is coming to be viewed as more than a repository for anecdote or chronology, and can, if we allow it, produce a decisive transformation in the philosophy of science that we now possess. [p. vii, their emphasis]

I shall comment on this reformist program at the end, but first let us see what the volume contains.

In “Logical Empiricism, American Pragmatism, and the Fate of Scientific Philosophy in America,” Richardson challenges the “standard account” according to which a small group of technically-minded European refugees came to America and quickly supplanted the deeply-rooted native pragmatism with a radically different philosophy. His main point is that the pragmatists welcomed rather than opposed the LEs—as joining their effort to establish a scientific philosophy. While Richardson’s contribution is illuminating, I find his statement of the problem rather forced. He does not attribute the “standard account” to anyone in particular (although I suspect that he has in mind Richard Rorty’s casual generalizations), and I don’t know of anyone who thinks that pragmatism and LE were radically different qua scientific philosophies in the context of that time. Good history debunks myths, but it seems to me that the myth Richardson debunks is in part his own creation. Richardson is surely correct that the common purposes of the pragmatists and LEs outweighed their differences in their battle against common foes, but that does not preclude a later, postwar emphasis on differences, especially given that, by then, Carnap’s antinaturalistic formalism had become the dominant strain of LE. Once old, common enemies are defeated, it is natural for those living in the new historical context to highlight their differences. Richardson (and others) are right to emphasize that we cannot simply label LE anti-naturalistic, since Neurath and his sympathizers were naturalists. The fact remains that Neurath’s views were deliberately ignored or suppressed by Carnap, Reichenbach, and others after his death, and he never had much of a presence on the American scene. Along the way, Richardson provides the clearest summary I have seen of the differences between Carnap and Quine on the analytic-synthetic distinction (a topic treated in more detail in the final two chapters), and he points out significant ways in which Quine’s position is actually more conservative than Carnap’s.

Don Howard’s rich chapter is my personal favorite. He faces head-on the question of what current philosophy of science is good for. In “Two Left Turns Make a Right: On the Curious Political Career of North American Philosophy of Science at Midcentury,” he answers the question of why, given the strong political and social motivation of both the Vienna Circle and Deweyan pragmatism, philosophy of science after World War II became a politically neutral, technical specialty that lost its political and social relevance, leaving the field open to loose leftist movements of questionable intellectual rigor.

To me, it is astounding and dismaying that almost nowhere in this culture war does one hear the loud, clear voice of a credible, left-liberal, empiricist, naturalist philosophy of science, all the more so when one recalls the social and political concerns that motivated Neurath and Dewey in the 1930s or even Philipp Frank and Sidney Hook in the 1950s. [p. 26]
We assume that thinkers who argued for the cognitive meaningless of normative discourse could not, qua philosophers, take a political stance. Nothing could be further from the truth. [p. 31]

Nearly all the LEs were leftists or liberals and some were political activists, Neurath being the leading example. Like Dewey, Neurath defended philosophical naturalism and rejected the rigid formalism of Carnap. Both men regarded philosophy as a basis for social and political change. But Neurath died in 1945, and Dewey was by then an old man. Accordingly, it was easy to ignore the positions of both men. But they were being marginalized before that. Howard thinks it was no coincidence that Reichenbach published his distinction of context of discovery from context of justification (the DJ distinction) in the same year, 1938, that he began teaching at UCLA. Reichenbach, a former radical leftist himself, now restricted philosophy proper to context of justification, whereas value considerations were consigned to context of discovery. Carnap agreed: value considerations are terribly important in life but cannot enter into technical philosophical work. Howard traces the increasingly conservative stance of philosophers of science as they turned the field into a professional academic specialty. For example, public philosophy and amateur work, including that by scientists themselves, became increasingly unwelcome in the pages of the leading American journal, Philosophy of Science. The fact that American scientists did not consider themselves culture carriers to the extent that European ones did surely did not help, nor did the intimidating atmosphere of the McCarthy era.

One of the attractions of the book is that it contains separate chapters on their transition to America of four individual LEs: Carl Hempel, Herbert Feigl, Edgar Zilsel, and Philipp Frank. In the first of these contributions, Michael Friedman tells the fascinating story of how Hempel, as a student, spent a semester studying in Vienna. He was invited to attend the sessions of the Vienna Circle at the time of the protocol-sentence debate, the subject of his own earliest publications. Young Hempel was most impressed by Neurath and Carnap. The story then skips to the end of Hempel’s career—how he (the best-loved of the LEs and this reviewer’s own Doktorvater) fundamentally altered his previous position by articulating arguments against a deductivist conception of confirmation, explanation, and other issues, the seeds of which can be found in his earliest work under Neurath’s influence. The point is that Hempel, after falling under the spell of Carnapian formal methods of explication for most of his career, finally, under the acknowledged influence of Kuhnian historicism and naturalism, returned to a position closer to Neurath’s. As some readers will know, near the end of his life, Hempel declared that he had made a wrong career turn to follow Carnap’s line rather than Neurath’s.

Rudolf Haller, one of the scholars who has contributed most to the history movement, then writes on Herbert Feigl’s translocation to America. Feigl, a student of Moritz Schlick, was the first member of the Vienna Circle to come permanently. Haller fills in the largely unknown details of the precocious Feigl’s early career and the circumstances of his coming to America, first to Harvard on a Rockefeller fellowship, then to a teaching position at the University of Iowa before he moved on to Minnesota, where he established the Minnesota Center for Philosophy of Science. The Center became a model for other such centers and departments.

Diederick Raven recounts the unhappy transition to America of Edgar Zilsel. Although a contributor to Neurath’s Encyclopedia of Unified Science, Zilsel was on the periphery of the Vienna Circle while in Europe, and even more so in America. His unhappiness eventually led to suicide in 1944. This case serves to remind us that it was no easy task for European intellectuals to give up everything and come to the very different social and intellectual environment of the USA, thence to make suitable intellectual and social contacts, and to find a regular academic position. Unfortunately, Zilsel’s intellectual interests and uncompromising character did not make him attractive to either history or philosophy departments. America was not the land of opportunity for everyone.

Thomas Uebel’s point of departure in “Philipp Frank’s History of the Vienna Circle: A Programmatic Perspective” is the somewhat different accounts Frank gave of the Vienna Circle in major publications some years apart, before and after Neurath’s death. Frank presented himself, Hans Hahn, and Otto Neurath, as the original, core members of the “first” Vienna Circle of the pre-World War I years, hence, also of the second (and better known) Circle, as the only surviving member of this core after 1945, and the primary defender of Neurath’s line. Frank’s emigration to America was only partially successful. He became a part-time lecturer at Harvard, but he was never in a position to gain much influence. Accordingly, Frank’s efforts to preserve the “left wing” of the Vienna Circle in America and to continue Neurath’s commitment to a value-theoretic philosophy of science (including the effort to cooperate with Dewey and his followers) fell largely on deaf ears, although the wide-ranging Boston Colloquium for the Philosophy of Science, founded by Robert Cohen, is an important successor to this work.

Hardcastle then presents an account of something completely unknown to this reviewer, a Harvard “science of science” discussion group that lasted but one year, 1940-41. It was quite a year at Harvard, with Bertrand Russell visiting to give the William James lectures, Carnap, Tarski, and Feigl, all present, along with Quine and Percy Bridgman and other distinguished Harvard professors such as émigrés J. A. Schumpeter and Richard von Mises. The discussion group was run by psychologist S. S. Stevens. Hardcastle interestingly brings out the important difference between Stevens’ conception of operationism and that of his physicist colleague, Bridgman.

In “Disunity in The International Encyclopedia of Unified Science,” George Reisch, alert to the irony, details the strong tensions among Neurath, the founder of the project, and Carnap and Charles Morris, the other two principals. Neurath’s grandiose plan for hundreds of volumes, to be published in a monthly subscription series by the University of Chicago Press, ultimately failed, as only twenty were eventually published, at an average rate of less than one per year. (The most famous was Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions, often supposed to have killed logical empiricism.) Neurath botched a major private grant that would have greatly benefited the project, and then he suddenly died. Carnap and Morris had less enthusiasm for the project and all the work involved in it, and many deprecated the quality of Neurath’s own volume in the series. Meanwhile, Morris felt that he was being unfairly used by Neurath and Carnap, after all that he had done to help the LEs get established in America. Reisch holds that it was the failure of the Encyclopedia project that eventually led to the demise of logical empiricism. Reisch’s essay is also interesting from a historiographic point of view. He integrates personal and political considerations with intellectual ones without the distortion of a sharp internal/external distinction. In addition, he critiques explanations, such as Peter Galison’s, that seem to rest on the assumption that large effects must have large causes. Reisch worries that explanations in terms of large historical forces are causally vague. His own account is “small-large” rather than “large-large.” Small causes sometimes have large effects. I would agree that history is often nonlinear in this sense. Logical empiricism, contends Reisch, was too complex an enterprise to explain its failure either in large cultural terms, as Galison (1996) does, or in large intellectual terms, as Frederick Suppe (1974) does.

Friedrich Stadler, another of the eminent European contributors to the volume, writes on “Transfer and Transformation of Logical Empiricism: Quantitative and Qualitative Aspects.” He brings out how poorly the usual sort of intellectual “history of philosophy” serves to explain this transfer and transformation. If philosophers are going to do this sort of history, they need seriously to engage immigration studies. Stadler’s chapter includes a gold mine of references to the literature on emigration and cultural transfer and transformation. He notes that the Frankfurt School, by contrast with the LE émigrés, retained their linkage to German culture. Prominent members of that school eventually returned to Germany after the war.

The final two chapters are more technical than historical. In “The Linguistic Doctrine and Conventionality: The Main Argument in ’Carnap and Logical Truth’,” Richard Creath returns to Quine’s famous critique of Carnap and argues that it is not persuasive. Creath thus complements Richardson in urging that we not simply take it for granted today that Quine is correct, although that is the current fashion. Creath’s main point is that Quine’s claim that elementary logic is “obvious” cannot bear the weight that Quine eventually hangs from it. With “Languages and Calculi” Thomas Ricketts concludes the volume. Like Creath, he explores the reasons why Quine and Carnap, despite talking with one another frequently, both personally and in publications, ended up talking past one another on the main issues. Ricketts argues that the sources of disagreement concerned how to understand logical notation, how to apply logical calculi to science, and, ultimately, the nature of mathematical truth. This ancient problem continues to plague empiricism.

The valuable discussion of the Carnap-Quine debate by Richardson, Creath, and Ricketts debunks what is perhaps another myth—that Carnap and Quine did directly engage each others’ positions. Rather, it appears that they largely talked past one another, each regarding the other as begging the crucial questions.

I am a consumer rather than a producer of history of logical empiricism. As such, I am not prepared to challenge specific interpretations based on archival evidence. However, I do want to return to the editors’ main thesis—that a return to history is a good way to reinvigorate philosophy of science. What are we to make of the editors’ strong claim? Mindful of the remark that any discipline preoccupied with its own history is bound to stagnate (reversing the cause-effect relation of the editors’ introduction), we should approach the claim with skepticism. It is also not immediately clear just what is being claimed, since several of the authors explicitly disavow the intellectual desirability of a return to logical empiricism. Theirs is not a “back to positivism” movement. So is it simply that we need a new, grand synthesis to make our field more visible? That does not seem to be the message either, since our authors agree that the grand synthesis of the LEs was largely an illusion. Besides, today it is the special fields of philosophy of biology, cognitive science, and physics rather than general methodology that are flourishing. We surely do not want to return to a theory-centered or physics-centered philosophy of science or to one requiring the use of a rigid canonical language for work to count as serious. Nor do we need a semi-official reductivism that requires the unity of science, either as unity of language, unity of method, or unity of doctrine. A return to deductivism or probabilism would not be helpful either. However, a partial “return to the source” on a specific issue or two does make sense, so let me begin there.

Value theory is the issue where the strongest case for a return to the source can be made, in my judgment, and Don Howard makes it. Philosophy of science (and Anglo-American philosophy as a whole) needs to make itself more relevant to the scientific community and to human society. We must make philosophy of science matter by engaging moral and policy issues related to science and technology. In the USA at this moment of writing (spring 2004), the President and his administration are making major decisions that appear to go against sound science. Indeed, the very phrase ’sound science’ has been corrupted by politicians and corporate executives. Why are not philosophers of science raising more of a clamor against these policies? Why are only a few philosophers speaking out on topics such as risk assessment? I mean speaking out in prominent public venues, not merely in learned journals. It may take awhile to re-open those venues, but it will help when we have something relevant to say.

Theoretical frameworks. Friedman’s reappraisal of Schlick and Reichenbach’s early work on relativity theory showed how historical study can be highly relevant to current work, in this case the need for large frameworks that are a priori but only relatively or pragmatically so. He shows how Carnap’s and even Kuhn’s work fits neatly into this line of development.

The context of discovery / context of justification (DJ) distinction. One can read the historical revolution achieved by Kuhn and others as reversing the DJ distinction, that is, using one of their primary supporting principles as a weapon against the then-dominant LEs. Reichenbach, Carnap, and their followers asserted that only justification is a philosophical concern, whereas Kuhn denied the relevance of the philosophers’ confirmation and corroboration theories to real science and urged attention to scientific practices—to the processes rather than the logical structure of the products, that is, precisely what the LEs had excluded. However, subsequent work in philosophy of science pursued this line only half-heartedly, with the result that science studies stepped in to fill the perceived void. Philosophers began seriously to discuss experimental practices (for example) only late in the day—in the 1980s. Fairly or not, philosophers got the bad rap of being empiricists who urged everyone else but themselves to be empirical. We surely don’t want to turn back the clock here. But wait! It was mainly the Americanized Reichenbach and Carnap and their followers who enforced a discipline-shaping DJ distinction, not Neurath and his sympathizers. In a related article, Howard forthcoming) contends that Reichenbach introduced the DJ distinction in part to marginalize Neurath.

The more historically-minded contributors to the volume recognize the need to do good social history, including sociology of knowledge, as well as intellectual history, and that philosophers are only beginning to learn how to do this. This strategy is surely crucial to understanding the place of philosophical movements in the larger culture. The kind of nonhistorical intellectual examination of arguments and positions in canonical sequence that usually passes for “history of philosophy” will simply not do. Political historians and even historians of science have long understood this. You cannot compartmentalize people’s lives, attend to only one compartment, and yet claim to understand them. This openness to forms of explanation found in social history can help blur the boundary between philosophy and (the rest of) science studies.

This theme is especially prominent in several of the chapters, and it is perhaps implicit even in the more technical pieces by Creath and Ricketts. Both authors find Quine’s arguments against Carnap unconvincing, which raises the question why Quinean and related versions of naturalism and pragmatism prevailed. Here we have something like the opposite of Richardson’s opening question. Now, instead of asking how it was possible for a small band of refugees to supplant a deeply-rooted native philosophy so quickly, we have the question of how the neo-version of that native philosophy was able to make such a rapid comeback. How was it possible that such a dominant philosophy as academically entrenched as LE was overturned so quickly? Here I agree with Richardson’s line that the answer in both cases will require revising the questions themselves and their presuppositions.

As the reader will note, I am step-by-step overcoming my initial skepticism about the editors’ thesis. Serious historical research can help us appreciate ways in which philosophers of science have gratuitously left important vacuums for others to fill and suicidally cut ourselves off from important segments of the scientific, academic, and socio-political communities. The field needs missions or goals that go beyond those of an academic specialty. Of course, there are some rather local ones already in existence, but we need to show a larger world why philosophy of science matters. There still may be time to correct these mistakes.

A good way to understand the editors’ thesis is that by rehabilitating Neurath and his strong voice in the European phase of the Vienna Circle and now, for the first time, giving him the large presence that he never gained in America (or anywhere else after World War II), we can take steps toward accomplishing several of the above-mentioned goals. By thus following in Hempel’s footsteps, adding a more activist political orientation, and recasting our disciplinary master narrative, the new story we tell about ourselves can be revitalizing.

Personally, I like this way of looking at things, although I would not expect all of the volume’s authors to agree. The prospective change in self-image that this move brings resonates with the editors’ Kuhnian formulation of their thesis. It amounts to using the “real” history of positivism to destroy the stereotypes that still function to shape the field. However, if this is our goal in doing the history, then we should be aware that we are doing disciplinary history, history with a purpose and history that issues in judgments of the sort: “Neurath was basically right and Carnap basically wrong.” Such history is quite legitimate, in my opinion, but it will attract the critical attention of purists who say that history should only be done for its own sake.

I highly recommend this important book. It is full of fascinating material and is, for the most part, very readable. The editors are to be commended for assembling such an excellent group of contributors.


Galison, Peter. 1996. “Constructing Modernism: The Cultural Location of the Aufbau.” In Origins of Logical Empiricism. In Giere and Richardson (1996), pp. 11-44.

Giere, Ronald, and Alan Richardson, eds., 1996. Origins of Logical Positivism. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.

Howard, Don. (Forthcoming). “Lost Wanderers in the Forest of Knowledge: Some Thoughts on the Discovery-Justification Distinction.” In Schickore and Steinle.

Schickore, Jutta, and Friedrich Steinle, eds. Forthcoming. Rethinking the Discovery-Justification Distinction (or similar title). Dordrecht: Kluwer.

Suppe, Frederick. 1974. “The Search for Philosophic Understanding of Scientific Theories.” In his The Structure of Scientific Theories. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, pp. 3-232.