Louis Althusser and the Traditions of French Marxism

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William S. Lewis, Louis Althusser and the Traditions of French Marxism, Lexington Books, 2005, 238pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0739113070.

Reviewed by Bruce Baugh, Thompson Rivers University


In the world after the fall of the Berlin Wall, the collapse of the Soviet Union, the capitalist "reforms" of the Chinese economy, what remains for us, now, of Marx? William Lewis addresses this question by examining the "Structural Marxism" of Louis Althusser, which enjoyed its hey-day in the 1960s and 1970s. His approach is to place Althusser's thought within the context of the history of the French Communist Party (or PCF, Parti Communiste Français) and the history of French intellectual Marxism (Henri Lefebvre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Jean-Paul Sartre and others) leading up to Althusser's emergence as an important figure both in the PCF and on the French intellectual scene with the 1965 publication of his ground-breaking For Marx and (in collaboration with others such as Pierre Macherey and Étienne Balibar) Reading Capital.

Lewis portrays these works as emerging from the crisis in PCF and other French Marxist circles following the denunciation of Stalin by Khrushchev at the Twentieth Congress of the Communist Party of the Soviet Union and the subsequent Soviet invasion of Hungary in 1956. Althusser's solution to the crisis, says Lewis, was to refute both Stalinist orthodoxy, with its belief in a law of dialectical development that would inevitably lead from the economic contradictions of capitalism to the establishment of a classless society under "the dictatorship of the proletariat," and the "humanist" Marxism that followed in the wake of Stalinism's demise. In place of Stalinism's reduction of science to an arm of politics (as in the notorious pseudo-science of Lyssenko), Althusser argued for the autonomy of theory; against both Stalinism and humanism, he argued against teleological conceptions of history, whether the end of history is conceived of as "full communism" (Stalinism) or the end of alienation (humanism). In doing so, he pointed to the possibility of a "science of Historical Materialism" capable of analysing how socio-economic structures function and the ideological effects they produce, a science which can enable us to determine what sort of socio-economic changes are possible given present realities. It is not (contrary to what Althusser sometimes claims) as if Althusser gives us "the real Marx;" Marxism is not a set of timeless truths or "classical" texts. Rather, Althusser's interpretation must be understood in light of the history of the French interpretation and application of Marxism. To see what remains valuable in Marxism today, we must look at the history of French attempts to use Marxism to solve problems of other times and other places, including the history of French Marxism's errors.

Although Althusser is very much the hero of this story, he does not enter the picture until chapter six; the first five chapters go through the history of the PCF and of French intellectual Marxism from 1920 (the founding of the PCF) to 1956. Lewis shows the shifts in PCF policy and how its more "open" or liberal phases, such as during the Popular Front of the 1930s, coincided both with its greatest success at the polls and the most productive periods of French Marxist thought, whereas the constraints on party direction issuing from Moscow led to narrowly sectarian "class against class" policies that resulted in intellectual stagnation and political isolation. As in the Soviet Union, the PCF's "Marxist-Leninist catechisms" owed more to Engels and Plekhanov's simplifications and reductions than to Marx, a process which reached its nadir with the French publication of Stalin's History of the Bolshevik Party of the Soviet Union (Short Course) in 1939, which was treated as the "definitive" version of Marxism, rendering Marxist intellectuals superfluous. Nevertheless, the Party attracted some brilliant minds in one of its "open" phases during the Popular Front alliance in the 1930s: Paul Nizan, Georges Politzer, René Maublanc, Henri Lefebvre, Norbert Guterman and Georges Friedmann. Although Politzer and Nizan became quite orthodox and Stalinized, Lefebvre and his associates developed a Hegelian Marxism focused on the problem of alienation, while Maublanc and the Cercle de la Russie Neuve worked on the relation of dialectical materialism to modern science (physics, biology, psychology). In the 1945-48 period, when the PCF held ministries in the post-Liberation government, the PCF allowed Lefebvre to pursue his Hegelian Marxism, while the prestige that accrued to the PCF as the "Party of the Resistance" attracted existentialists such as Jean-Paul Sartre and Maurice Merleau-Ponty to Marxism, even though the PCF vilified them both. After 1948, the Party retreated to ideological narrowness until 1956 brought about the collapse of the Stalin cult.

Lewis' telling of this part of the story is clear and mostly unobjectionable, but for the most part, he does not break new ground: David Caute's Communism and the French Intellectuals (1964), George Lichtheim's Marxism in Modern France (1966) and Michael Kelly's Modern French Marxism (1982) have covered this topic in much greater detail, and Lewis frequently refers to them. His account of Lefebvre's circle owes a very great deal (as he acknowledges) to Bud Burkhard's French Marxism Between the Wars: Henri Lefebvre and the 'Philosophies' (2000). However, Lewis does provide some very interesting translations of excerpts from PCF publications of the period and some works by French intellectual Marxists (Maublanc, Lucien Monod) which are virtually unknown to English-speaking readers.

The real problem concerns his interpretation of French Marxist thought before 1956. Much as Stalin (following Lenin) divided his opponents into Right Deviationists and Left Deviationists, with the truth to be found in the Stalinist middle, so too Lewis constructs a false alternative between Stalinist French Marxism (right deviationism) and humanist Marxism (left deviationism), the better to prepare the way for the saviour of French Marxism, Althusser. In truth, French Stalinism is beyond parody, but Lewis' treatments of Lefebvre, Merleau-Ponty and Sartre makes them into "straw men." All of them are accused of "idealism," primarily because they make "alienation" central to Marxism, and they consequently interpret the mature Marx through the young Marx of the 1844 Economic and Philosophic Manuscripts and the young Marx through Hegel. Lewis' treatment of Merleau-Ponty and Sartre is cursory in the extreme; the latter is reduced to Being and Nothingness (a non-Marxist work), and his turn to Marxism is dismissed as an emotional reaction to the trumped-up arrest of Communist leader Jacques Duclos in 1952, with nothing of substance about Sartre's Critique of Dialectical Reason or his Idiot of the Family. The very little that is said of Alexandre Kojève and Jean Hyppolite is also misleading, particularly in the case of the latter, whose theory of Hegelian contradiction in Logic and Existence (1953) influenced Althusser in ways that Lewis does not acknowledge.

But it is Lefebvre who is treated most unfairly. Lewis more or less assumes Althusser's position that there is an "epistemological break" between the young Marx and the mature Marx and between Hegel and Marx, but since Lefebvre argues at length for the continuity of Marx's work, it is rather question-begging to accuse Lefebvre of simply being in error. It is rather worse to state that Lefebvre encompasses Marx "within the confines of the Hegelian system" (107) or that Lefebvre holds that liberation from alienation can be accomplished "conceptually," through thought and culture, when Lefebvre takes pains to distinguish dialectical materialism from Hegel's idealism and consciously guided material praxis from "the realm of pure thought." Lefebvre nowhere says that "thought itself is the world" (130) or that thought is not determined by material conditions; in fact, he says that the illusion of thought detached from social-historical conditions is itself a product of a contradiction in social-historical conditions.[1] Nor does he neglect class struggle or the role of the proletariat, and he never says that alienation can be overcome "by cultural and artistic means" alone (135). Lewis does mention the "self-criticism" Lefebvre had to publish at the behest of the Party, in which Lefebvre repented of his Hegelianism and "subjectivism," but not Lefebvre's later disavowal of this as "a stain on my honor as a philosopher." Since Lefebvre is the most important French Marxist before Althusser, it is salutary that Lewis would set up a debate between the two; unfortunately, the debate is one-sided, with Althusser having the last word, and Lefebvre reduced to a caricature.

All of this was necessary to support Althusser's claim that at the start of the 1960s, French Marxist philosophy did not exist, and that France lacked the solid Marxist intellectual traditions found in Germany, Italy and Russia. Enter Althusser, who comes to rescue French Marxism from Stalinist dogmatism and the "miscegenations" of humanist or Hegelian Marxism (161). Althusser wants to draw "a line of demarcation" between, on the one hand, genuine Marxist science of history (Historical Materialism) and philosophy (Dialectical Materialism), and pre-Marxist idealism, on the other. Lewis treats this as the philosophical effort to "distil a pure theory of Marxism" on the basis of Marx's classical texts and the "philosophical principles" of the PCF (163-4); J.-T. Desanti, himself a former Stalinist philosopher, describes this as the PCF militant philosopher's "pedagogical and critical task of preserving a clear and distinct outline: no contamination, the demarcation and safeguarding of difference," a rather more critical view of the drive for theoretical "purity."[2] No matter. Lewis goes on to describe and defend Althusser's Marxism, including the rather tricky business according to which economic practices, although "determining in the last instance," are not determining in all cases (172), and the "epistemological break" between Hegel and Marx, or between the young Marx and the mature Marx. Althusser's theoretical moves are seen as necessary to avoid the teleological and ideological interpretations of Stalinist economic determinism and humanist Marxism, and to uncover Marx as the discoverer of a new science: Historical Materialism, a non-teleological analysis of the specific contradictions between different practices and different levels and modes of production within a given society.

Is Althusser's Marxism really "purified" of Hegelianism and other "pre-scientific" and "ideological" content? When Lewis cites For Marx on "overdetermination," that is, on how the general contradiction between the mode of production and productive forces "is inseparable from its formal conditions of existence… and determined by the various levels and instances of the social formation it animates," and that "the ensemble of contradictions that make up the 'whole' system" determine each particular contradiction,[3] this does not seem very far from Hegel: it may be far from the humanist reading of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit and philosophy of history, as Althusser argues, but not from the Science of Logic's treatment of contradiction in the sections on the Doctrine of Essence or on the Absolute Idea. So what is the difference between Hegel's science of logic dealing with the self-becoming of the concept and Althusser's (or Marx's) science of historical materialism dealing with "a historico-dialectical materialism of praxis: that is… a theory of the different specific levels of human practice (economic practice, political practice, ideological practice, scientific practice) in their characteristic articulations, based on the specific articulations of the unity of human society"?[4] The difference is not, as Lewis would have it, that in Hegel, "the parts of a whole are… manifestations of a central essence" whereas in Althusser "the structure, which is merely a combination of its elements, is nothing outside its effects," and the effects themselves are immanent to the structure (174), for the same relation of immanence obtains within the Absolute Idea. But neither, according to Lewis, is the difference the one Marx stated: that in Hegel the dialectic is standing on its head in that it makes thought the reality standing behind the world as mere appearance whereas for Marx the mental is "nothing but the material world reflected in the human mind"[5] -- that is, that Marx's dialectic is materialist and Hegel's is idealist (180). Rather, the difference is that Althusser's materialist dialectic is "nothing but the abstract description of actually occurring contradictions," not a teleological process leading to unalienated humanity (179).

As Lewis points out, this non-teleological conception of the dialectic puts paid to the Communist Manifesto's thesis that history is a process driven by class struggle that will culminate in the victory of the proletariat and the establishment of a classless society (198). History is not simply a process without a subject (whether that be Geist, humanity or the proletariat as the "universal class") and without a goal,[6] but barely a "process" at all, and the task of Marxist theory is analytical: "to understand social structures for what they are and what they can do" (203), or to determine the relations between one's economic role, geographical locale, education and religious upbringing, political affiliations and one's values (195). If this seems closer to Montesquieu or Comte than to Marx, this is hardly surprising given Althusser's affinity to the former two and his great anxiety to expunge from Marxism any Hegelian remnants. It does, however, have the unfortunate result, as E. J. Hobsbawm pointed out in his 1966 review of For Marx and Reading Capital, of eliminating the bulk of Marx's writing from Marxism;[7] it also seems to deprive Marxism not only of its revolutionary impetus, but of the object of its study: the dialectic of history, which is reduced to "the actual developments of socioeconomic structures in history" (203). If Marxism is to become in effect a materialist sociology, then it would seem that Henri Lefebvre's work on rural and urban life, "the production of space" and the like have more to offer than Althusser's lucubrations about theory.

The role and place of theory is a central concern of Lewis' interpretation of Althusser. Lewis argues that the Stalinist and humanist interpretations of Marx were not only theoretically untenable, but had harmful consequences for the political practice of the PCF (166); Althusser's goal, accordingly, was to reform the PCF "by reinterpreting its basic philosophical principles" through a return to Marx's original texts (158-9, 163) -- a goal that in itself seems rather Quixotic, not to mention "idealist." Nevertheless, Althusser regards theory -- "theoretical practice" -- as of great practical importance. Philosophy's role is to separate out what is truly scientific from what is ideological in science, most importantly the science of Historical Materialism discovered by Marx in Capital. Just as the physics of Galileo and Newton had to wait for Kant's Critique of Pure Reason to receive a philosophical justification of its claims to knowledge with respect to the limits and conditions of the possibility of such knowledge, so Capital contains an implicit philosophical justification which needs to be made explicit through an analysis of Capital's "conditions of production" (167), which would determine "by means of what concepts" Historical Materialism is made possible. Philosophy, like science, is a theoretical practice, but at the meta- or transcendental level: it "guarantees the internal coherence of science" and makes explicit its internal logic through the work it performs on its concepts (170-1). The validity of a science is then internally determined, by a materialist "transcendental deduction" that extracts the rational kernel of concepts from their mystical shell, as it were, rather than through empirical confirmation. Even so, science is not sealed off from the practical or the real: new theories allow new questions to be posed and problematics to be developed, and these in turn further define and determine the developing science. If the basic concepts of a science are not purified of their ideological content, then the developments of the science, and the ensuing applications of science to the real, will be skewed: thus, Stalin's reductivist version of dialectical materialism led to the notorious outrages of Soviet political practice (178).

Lewis notes that Althusser himself regarded this position as too "theoreticist" (175) because of its internalist conception of truth, and that Althusser's theoretical interventions made no real difference to PCF policy or philosophy, but he doesn't make the connection. Although he acknowledges (186 n. 74) the real factors leading to the failure of PCF policies -- its identification with the USSR, the waning prospects for revolution, its adherence to "democratic centralism" -- any Marxist or materialist should have been able to predict in advance that a theoretical debate about Stalinism, humanism and Marxism would have no bearing on the real world or electoral campaigns, foreign policy, domestic policy, trade unions, class relations, the economy, and alliances with other parties (such as the Socialists); as Lewis states, the PCF's inability to reform itself was "overdetermined" (178). At best, Althusser's strategy succeeded in preserving some degree of autonomy for theory, saving it from Stalinist dogmatism and pseudo-science, but even this achievement surely is more a result of the changing political climate in France and the USSR than of Althusser's "intervention." It is a bit ironic that Lewis says that it is Lefebvre who gives "too much emphasis to the power of thought (and in this sense is not materialist at all)" (107) when even at the end of the book, he holds that philosophy "potentially has the power to affect and change conceptual and ideological structures" (207).

Very late in the book, Lewis states that Althusser's reading of Marx depends on a "historical conjuncture" of "the most advanced theoretical discourses of his day": Gaston Bachelard and Jean Cavaillès' philosophies of science and of the concept, Claude Lévi-Strauss' structuralist anthropology, Jacques Lacan's structuralist psychoanalysis (190). A sustained discussion of this theoretical "conjuncture" would have done much to clarify Althusser's "anti-humanism" and his insistence on an "epistemological break" between the young, Hegelian Marx and the mature Marx. Similarly, a discussion of the rise of the Gaullist Fifth Republic and the ensuing feeling of political stasis, the emergence in 1965 of the new Parti Socialiste, the student-worker upheaval of 1968 and the rise of the Maoists, the fall of Khrushchev and the demise of "liberalization" in the USSR, all would have helped illuminate the political "conjuncture" framing the PCF's political and theoretical debates. As for the present "conjuncture," Lewis hardly deals at all with the numerous books concerning "what's left of Marxism" which have appeared since 1989, nor with rival claimants to the field of left-wing philosophy (Badiou, Deleuze, Negri and Hardt, Laclau and Mouffe). The book also should have been more carefully edited: Kostas Axelos is referred to as "Juan," Emmanuel Mounier becomes "Emmanuelle," the leader of the 1956 Hungarian rising, Imre Nagy, becomes the leader of the "Prague Spring," Alexander Dubcek, and so on.

If the book's central argument -- that Althusser's philosophy gives us the best resources for constructing a Marxism for our time -- fails, the book itself does not. For one, Lewis gives a lucid and accessible account of some of Althusser's most important and interesting ideas, relying not only on published sources, but also on the unpublished (and untranslated) manuscripts collected in the Fonds Althusser in Paris. His account of PCF intellectuals in the 1920s-30s also makes excellent use of rare and untranslated original sources, such as the PCF journal Cahiers du bolchévisme, and his discussion of the PCF's shifting theoretical and political positions from 1920-45 nicely integrates intellectual developments into their political context. Finally, if Lewis' book renews interest in Althusser's philosophy, that in itself would be enough, for Althusser is a great philosopher of difference, as interesting in his way as Deleuze, Derrida or Foucault.

[1] Henri Lefebvre, Marx (Geneva and Paris: Éditions des Trois-Collines, 1947), 56-59.

[2] Jean-Toussaint Desanti, "A Path in Philosophy," trans. Kathleen McLaughlin, in Alan Montefiore, ed., Philosophy in France Today (Cambridge University Press, 1983), 56.

[3] Louis Althusser, For Marx, trans. Ben Brewster (London and New York: Verso), 101-6.

[4] Althusser, For Marx, 229.

[5] Karl Marx, Capital, trans. Ben Fowkes (Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1990), "Postface to the Second German Edition," 102-3.

[6] Louis Althusser, Politics and History: Montesquieu, Rousseau, Marx, trans. Ben Brewster (London: New Left Books, 1972), 161-86).

[7] E. J. Hobsbawm, "The Structure of Capital," in Gregory Elliott, ed., Althusser: A Critical Reader (Oxford: Blackwell, 1994), 9 n.3.