Love, Friendship, & the Self: Intimacy, Identification, & the Social Nature of Persons

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Bennett W. Helm, Love, Friendship, & the Self: Intimacy, Identification, & the Social Nature of Persons, Oxford UP, 2010, 316 pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199567898

Reviewed by Erica Lucast Stonestreet, College of St. Benedict/St. John's University



Bennett Helm’s Love, Friendship & the Self is an intricate and at times technical account of love and other attitudes that contribute to the identities of individuals. His central claim is that

our being capable of love and friendship is part of what makes us be persons, and their importance in defining personhood forces us to reject some pervasive assumptions about ourselves and so to rethink what we persons essentially are (1).

Helm looks most specifically at what he calls “personal love,” which he distinguishes from the love of projects or objects with which we identify ourselves (calling the latter “valuing” rather than “love.”)

The two main philosophical assumptions that prevent us from a full understanding of love, friendship and their importance for the self, according to Helm, are: (1) the division of mental states into the mutually exclusive and exhaustive categories of cognition and conation (rejection of this partition was the subject of a previous book-length treatment); and (2) individualism in two forms: (a) the “egocentric conception of intimate concerns” and (b) the “individualist conception of autonomy.” Only by rejecting these assumptions, Helm claims, can we make sense of our emotions as part of our identity as rational animals, and of the kind of intimacy that friendship and love make possible (12).

The best way to understand the scope and detail of the book is to understand the problems that motivate it. There are many, and for this reason the work it takes to make his account plausible can at times make for slow going. Our experience of love and friendship is complex, and Helm’s foremost desire is clearly to produce a comprehensive account of all of the phenomena that have driven previous (conflicting) accounts. Nevertheless, it is worth the investment of time for those who are interested in love, friendship, identity, or any of the connections among these concepts.

Helm begins with a survey of the problems and insights of the major accounts of love and friendship. Although he doesn’t put it this way, this survey results in a set of parameters that Helm seeks to satisfy with his new account of love. First, the account seeks to preserve the central insight that “particular personal relationships can significantly enhance our lives, our activity, and our autonomy by dissolving the social barriers that normally separate people from each other” (14). Second, if love is concern for the other’s sake, the account must capture the “sense of intimacy that is essential to love: although such intimacy requires a kind of closeness, it must also not undermine or blur the separateness of the two persons” (16). Third, the account must distinguish between love and other kinds of other-directed attitudes such as compassion. Fourth, it must show how love is responsive to reasons (i.e., how it can be justified) while also accounting for the insight that love creates value (i.e., is not merely a response to antecedent value) and solving the problem of fungibility — the problem that when a beloved is loved on the basis of properties she has, then she is as good as any other person who instantiates those same properties. Fifth, it must preserve our appreciation for the ways “in which love can be so important to us and to who we are: deciding to initiate and sustain particular loving relationships can be a matter of deciding how best to live my life and so what kind of person I ought to be” (32). His determination to recognize all of the important insights in different accounts of love thus motivates a detailed and ambitious exposition of his own view.

The heart of Helm’s account of love is his understanding of the relationship between identity and valuing. Valuing, as Helm defines it, goes beyond (mere) caring, that is, beyond finding something to have worth as a result of being the focus of a pattern of felt evaluations and judgments. Valuing “serves to define the kind of life it is worth living and so one’s identity as this person” (98). Valuing and caring differ not only in their “depth,” but also in their focus. In caring about something, the focus of my pattern of emotions and judgments is that thing. In valuing something, the focus of my pattern is a person (me), and the thing may be a subfocus of the larger structure of values that constitute my identity.

Understanding certain kinds of emotions (such as pride and shame) as person-focused in this way, Helm claims, is crucial to understanding how valuing constitutes identity and self-love. He writes:

in loving yourself, you are concerned with your well-being as this person, as this is defined in part by your values — by that which has import to you as constituents of the kind of life worth your living, as constituents of your identity as this person (107).

So what we have, according to Helm, is a circle. In identifying myself with something by valuing it, I give that thing a place within my overall identity as the particular person I am. We can’t, then, understand such identification apart from the whole identity. Thus, valuing things presupposes an identity. Yet at the same time, my identity is constituted by the things I value and the interconnections among them — identity presupposes valuing.

Helm recognizes that if his account of self-love is to be plausible, it must help us to make sense of love more generally. The constraints set by his criticisms of extant accounts motivate Helm’s account of love for another as a particular kind of “intimate identification” as “sharing in” the beloved’s identity, rather than assimilating that identity to one’s own.

First we must understand what it is to share certain felt evaluations. Helm writes:

for me to share … person-focused felt evaluations with [another] is for me to share the rational pattern of such felt evaluations focused on her and subfocused not just on [something she values] but also on the other things she values, insofar as these values constitute her identity … This is for me to value what she values not for my sake in that I make this a part of my identity, but for her sake, as a part of my commitment to the import she has to me" (157) (emphasis original).

So if my husband takes pride in his baking accomplishments, he values himself as a baker, building his identity in part around this activity; he is the focus of this emotion, and baking is its subfocus. Insofar as I love him, Helm claims, I share this pattern — and, in particular, its focus; my love for my husband gives him a particular place in my life. This accounts for the intimacy of love. Furthermore, because I love a person (who can define his identity by valuing), I am committed to his import as that person, and hence to valuing for his sake the things he values. So I am proud of him for his baking, not because I value his baking for my own sake (though I might well enjoy its products!), but because I value it for his sake.

Because the focus of my felt evaluations is my husband (and not myself), the account avoids the egocentric conception of intimate concerns while simultaneously preserving both intimacy and personal autonomy. Autonomy is preserved because “in being committed to the import [my beloved] has as this person I am committed to the proper exercise of those very capacities defining his personhood, including his autonomy” (159). My own autonomy is likewise preserved, in that respect leaves room for disagreement about what someone ought to value for his own sake. Furthermore, our identities haven’t merged, as in union accounts, because the values I adopt for his sake remain focused on him. Baking hasn’t become one of my values; I do not value it for my own sake, but for his.

Helm’s account of love is interesting on its own, but a further aspect of the account that adds to its interest is its application to our conception of personhood as an essentially social, shared phenomenon. Helm believes his account can illuminate the deep role that intimate relationships play in our lives in ways traditional philosophies have hitherto not sought to do because of the individualist conception of autonomy. Thus, he explicates the notion of a joint evaluative perspective, in the form of plural agency (when group members care about one another) and plural personhood (when they love one another).

The central feature of this account is the way in which the individuals in the group which is to become the plural agent shift the focus of their cares and values from the individuals in the group to the group itself, so that they come to do things not only for the sake of the individuals, but also for the sake of the group. They can deliberate together, refining and revising their conception of their joint values and activities from the perspective of “one of us” — not just from their own individual perspectives. Friendship, then, is basically the formation of this sort of plural agent or person. Helm argues that a plural agent, as a subject of import, has a capacity for autonomy in the sense that in deliberating as “one of us,” the individuals in the group can exert rational pressure on one another to shape their joint evaluative perspective and joint decisions about how to spend time together. This is parallel to the way we exercise autonomy individually; we must constantly monitor and revise our understandings of our own identities, and make decisions about activities in light of these understandings, and this is what it is for an individual to exercise autonomy.

This is where the account is most controversial because it represents a significant change to the way many of us consciously think about our friendships and shared activities. I found this final chapter to be considerably more persuasive than the preview in Chapter 1 led me to expect, however. Helm’s account of plural agency strikes me as capturing the sense in which we often do think and act for the sake of relationships, and not simply out of care or love for the other person in those relationships. I am more skeptical about the idea of joint autonomy, because his account (at least of plural personhood) seems to require a depth of conscious deliberation with others about lives worth living that strikes me as quite rare even in the most intimate of relationships. The worry is not that I don’t think autonomy can be shared, but rather that the view seems to make true friendship nearly impossible to achieve.

Still, Helm is right that we need to understand autonomy in a way that gives central importance to our social nature, and it’s certainly true that we haven’t paid much attention to the role relationships do play in our exercise of our own autonomy. His conception of autonomy is much more plausible than his description of the individualist conception: autonomy is a capacity we exercise as individuals, so that “our autonomy is undermined to the extent that our identities are shaped by others without our consent, thereby setting up rather strict boundaries between persons” (303). If this is truly the traditional conception of autonomy, then it was never very plausible in the first place. Given that we are social creatures, who place relationships of all kinds at the centers of our lives but don’t thereby diminish our autonomy, it’s hard to believe that the traditional, “individualist” conception of autonomy is quite as strong as Helm’s description makes it sound — especially since any commitment to any value will in some ways restrict our freedom of action in a way that, on the surface, would undermine autonomy. But this problem has been known for some time, and very few people defend the position that commitments undermine autonomy; most recognize, as Helm does, that they usually enhance it.

Since the ways we are bound by our plural agency are fully analogous to the ways we are bound by our individual values, if we do not think that autonomy is confined by values, then we shouldn’t think it is confined by the joint agency of friendship. Since values impose the rational constraints that make us persons at all, autonomy is enabled rather than curtailed by these values.

One of the attractions of this account is its flexibility. Helm shows how the friendships formed from plural agency can vary in both scope and depth. Thus, tennis buddies, whose interactions center entirely on playing, watching and discussing tennis can count as plural agents when they come to conceive of themselves as a group with this purpose in mind, and feel the consequent rational pressure to uphold group interests. Such a friendship is more limited in scope than, for instance, romantic relationships, which encompass considerably wider sets of activities and deeper sets of values. This way of viewing friendships makes sense of Aristotle’s friendships of utility and pleasure as genuine friendships in which the friends care about one another for their own sakes, and not as lesser forms of friendship with ulterior motives. They are simply more limited in scope, because the friends understand their relationship in terms of the activity that serves as their joint concern. But the grounds of the friendship — concern for one another and concern for the group as such — are the same as the grounds for deeper kinds of friendship.

This account may leave the reader with a number of questions, however. What does it take to make a plural agent? Is loyalty to groups such as Phi Beta Kappa or Bengali expatriates living in Boston enough to count as constituting one, even though I don’t know the majority of the other members? After all, it seems that I can feel like “one of us” and do things for that reason even if the concern I feel for the others is not fully specific and intimate.

Helm’s account of love and identity involves many mutual presuppositions among concepts — many circles which may at first seem vicious. At times this can make it difficult to get one’s head around the arguments. In the end, however, this may not be a bad thing. After all, the phenomena he’s trying to explicate are extremely complex, and the reason that questions of priority (Which comes first, identity or valuing? Emotion or judgment?) seem both so natural and so difficult is that, viewed from different angles, each answer seems appropriate. This should be a signal that an account which attempts to show how the answer to such questions can be “Both!” has something fundamentally attractive and/or correct about it. Thus, I believe that Helm’s account of these phenomena constitutes an improvement in our understanding of the relationships between love, friendship, and identity.