Love's Enlightenment: Rethinking Charity in Modernity

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Ryan Patrick Hanley, Love's Enlightenment: Rethinking Charity in Modernity, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 182pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107105225.

Reviewed by Deborah Boyle, College of Charleston


Ryan Patrick Hanley's book offers a carefully researched, interesting, and original survey of how four enlightenment philosophers transformed the traditional Christian ideal of what is variously called agape, caritas, or neighborly love. In particular, Hanley argues that Hume, Rousseau, Smith, and Kant developed, each in his own way, conceptions of other-directed sentiment that sought to mitigate egocentrism without appealing to the sort of self-transcendence required in the traditional Christian view. "Love is in the air," Hanley observes in his opening sentence, referring to recent books on love in philosophy, psychology, and history. Indeed, a number of journal articles published over the past five years have examined the role of love in the views of various figures in the history of philosophy. Hanley's book is a valuable contribution to this new focus on love.

In the Introduction, Hanley offers some remarks on possible political explanations of the current interest in other-directedness as an antidote to self-centeredness, and then offers a brief survey of three traditional conceptions of love: eros, philia, and agape. All of these, he observes, involve some kind of transcendence, where that means "an attempt to go beyond the limits of the self, and thereby to gain access to a realm that is dedicated to or oriented around certain goods recognizably superior to the goods of basic self-interest" (p. 6). It is this third conception of love, agape, that Hanley argues was transformed in the eighteenth century into various different notions of charitable love -- humanity in Hume, pity in Rousseau, sympathy in Smith, and love in Kant.

The second chapter focuses on Hume's sentiment of humanity as an antidote to Hobbesian egoism. Hanley has little to say about Hume's discussions of love and hatred in the Treatise, other than to observe that Hume's definitions of love and hatred there are "idiosyncratic" (p. 32). But he provides an illuminating discussion of Hume's views on agapic "love of mankind" in the Treatise and on Platonic eros in the essay "Of Love and Marriage," arguing that Hume's epistemology of impressions and ideas grounds his skepticism about both our ability to transcend the self in eros and our ability to transcend egoism in agape. Hanley sees in Hume's concept of "humanity" a "form of other-directedness [that] is at once sufficiently robust to withstand Hobbesian egocentrism and yet commensurate with Hume's epistemic commitments" (p. 36). In the rest of the chapter, he discusses the role of humanity in Hume's moral philosophy and politics, offers a solution to the puzzle of why Hume shifts from discussing sympathy in the Treatise to discussing humanity in the second Enquiry, and explores the ways in which Humean humanity differs from such sentiments as pity, benevolence, and love. Hanley's proposal for explaining Hume's shift from sympathy to humanity is especially interesting. Drawing on Hume's distinction of three kinds of relations, Hanley shows that Hume identifies sympathy with contiguity and humanity with resemblance (p. 43). The association with contiguity led Hume to see that sympathy is unsuited to counteracting egoism, Hanley argues, for it is difficult for us to sympathize with those far from us in space or time. In contrast, humanity can be both extended to all humans and felt by all humans. There is a great deal of interest in this chapter for Hume scholars as well as for more general readers.

In the third chapter, Hanley considers Rousseau's conception of pity. Hanley sees a paradox at the heart of Rousseau's thinking about love: "that love seeks a self-transcendence that the self is constitutionally incapable of realizing" (p. 69). In examinations of Rousseau's views on eros, patriotism, and agape, Hanley shows that, for Rousseau, all three forms of love suffer from this problem. Pity, according to Hanley's reading, is Rousseau's answer not just to the problem of limiting self-love but also to the problem of how the self can achieve transcendence, for pity allows us to "extend ourselves out of ourselves" (p. 74). Hanley offers a nuanced and interesting interpretation of Rousseau's concept of natural pity in the Second Discourse, showing how Rousseau links it with vision, and contrasting it with the "developed pity" of the Essay on the Origin of Languages and Book 4 of Emile. One especially interesting feature is Hanley's discussion of how Rousseau's theory of pity is related to his epistemology: developed pity has connections in Rousseau not just with imagination, but with capacities for comparison, judgment, reflection, and knowledge.

In the fourth chapter, Hanley turns to Adam Smith's views on sympathy, arguing persuasively that Smith's account emerges from his considerations not just of eros and philia but also of Christian agape. He examines Smith's comments on Christianity, on Eclecticism, on Hutcheson, and on flourishing and second-best societies in The Theory of Moral Sentiments, arguing that these passages all "attest to a sustained engagement with the Christian conception of love" (p. 119). Hanley argues that Smith developed the concept of sympathy to contrast with the particularity inherent in eros and with the "epistemic costs" that he saw as inherent in agape (p. 120). The benefit of sympathy is that it enables us to regulate and moderate self-love, but Hanley argues that Smith was well aware of the limitations of sympathy, specifically its failure to cause people to feel emotionally connected to the poor or suffering when they are not already connected to us. For this we need "virtue" (p. 128). It would be interesting to explore how (if at all) virtue is connected with the themes of self-love and agape that Hanley has been examining in the book, but this is not a project he undertakes.

In the next chapter, Hanley examines Kant's views on love and argues convincingly that Kant's account of love is richer and more nuanced than is usually thought. Although he has surprisingly little to say about Kant's distinction between practical and pathological love in the Lectures on Ethics, he provides an interesting discussion of a different, less well-known distinction that Kant makes in the second Critique between two kinds of self-love: Eigenliebe or benevolence towards oneself, and Eigend√ľnkel or "self-conceit." Hanley argues that Kant believes that the duty of practical love for others is properly grounded on Eigenliebe. Acknowledging that this seems like an odd view to ascribe to a philosopher who argued that moral worth derives from a will determined by reason alone, Hanley maintains that Kant thinks that Eigenliebe must be transformed "via extension by reason" (p. 151). Thus "practical love is best understood as proper self-love (Eigenliebe) extended by reason to others in a way that can meet the universalizing test of the categorical imperative" (p. 151). Hanley then connects Kant's views on love in the second Critique with his views in The Metaphysics of Morals by focusing on the neediness of humans: human neediness prompts self-love, which, when universalized, produces the "extended" self-love that is benevolence.

The book ends with a brief epilogue questioning whether any of these four philosophers has really succeeded in offering an account of other-directedness that will "enable us to realize our best aspirations" (p. 172). It is here that a reader might expect Hanley to connect his careful readings of Hume, Rousseau, Smith, and Kant with the 21st century concerns that he raised in the Introduction. There, he had suggested that these four philosophers might be useful resources for finding answers to the questions of why and how other-directed love might be the solution to the problems of globalized, capitalist societies (p. 3), presenting the book as an answer to what he describes as a contemporary demand for a "recovery of the primacy of love" in recent French thought and in Anglo-American liberal theory such as the work of Nicholas Wolterstorff and Martha Nussbaum (pp. 1-2). It may indeed be true that, as Hanley characterizes Nussbaum's project, we need to "recover the other-directedness that defines love as a means of mitigating the self-centeredness that defines our world" (p. 2). However, the book leaves unclear just how the views of these four thinkers might be helpful in achieving this goal; indeed, the final paragraph of the Epilogue takes a sudden and surprising turn in its suggestion that we might need to look to non-Western cultures in order to find the most fulfilling vision of love. Thus Hanley's attempt to motivate the project by suggesting that Enlightenment thinkers can provide useful resources for contemporary theorists feels a bit forced. In fact, the project is interesting enough in its own right, as a contribution to the history of philosophy and ideas, that it really does not need this additional attempt at a pragmatic justification.

Hanley emphasizes in the Introduction that he is not giving a history of the concept of love, or even a survey of eighteenth-century views on love (p. 17); his focus is the specific evolution of philia in the thinking of four particular figures, rather than on the ways that philia might have gradually altered in the period between the early Church Fathers and the Enlightenment. Nonetheless, Hanley suggests that concepts of other-directed sentiment and charity retained their appeal to transcendence until the Enlightenment "dethroned" that appeal to transcendence (p. 13). This stage, he says, "we can locate squarely in the Enlightenment" (p. 13). But I wonder if the dethroning might have been more gradual. Hanley notes that Descartes, Leibniz, Spinoza, Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, and Butler all discussed other-directedness before Hume (p. 18); it would be interesting to see how these philosophers' views on love bridged the spaces between the earlier Christian concept of agape, Hobbesian self-love, and the four views that Hanley discusses.

Indeed, in addition to the thinkers that Hanley names, early modern women philosophers also wrote about love, and their views, too, surely set the stage for the views of the philosophers whom Hanley discusses. For example, in her arguments for her specific brand of monism, Anne Conway wrote of the particular love between members of a species as well as of a "certain universal love in all creatures for each other" that derives from the fact that "all things are one in virtue of their primary substance or essence and are like parts or members of the same body" (Conway, p. 47). We love other creatures and God because of their goodness, Conway conceded, but she argued that the love of goodness is itself based on similarity: we "call something good . . . because it really or apparently pleases us on account of its similarity to us, or ours to it" (Conway, p. 47). Although God is central in Conway's metaphysics, she does not ground our love of others on a love of God.

To consider another example: as Jacqueline Broad has shown, Mary Astell's writings on love include both a traditional conception of love as agape, in which we must feel what Astell calls "love of desire" for God alone, and a conception of "love of benevolence" that is grounded on the claim that "we are all of one Nature and family" (Broad, p. 121). While Astell's account of benevolence is still Christian in its orientation -- Broad argues that Astell thought that cultivating benevolence requires love of God -- it does seem to be a step closer to Hume's emphasis on similarities among humans as a basis for the sentiment of humanity. Damaris Masham's A Discourse Concerning the Love of God marks a further shift in thinking about love, for Masham objects to the distinction between "love of desire" and "love of benevolence" (Masham, pp. 19, 25, 51), rejecting the suggestion that God alone is worthy of our "love of desire" (Masham, p. 42). She maintains that it is part of the "Order of Nature" that humans should love others (Masham, p. 83). Indeed, she sees the love of creatures as the route by which we come to the love of God: "If we lov'd not the Creatures," she writes, "it is not conceiveable how we should love God" (Masham, p. 62). There seem here to be intimations of the skepticism that Hanley ascribes to Hume regarding the possibility of transcendent love of God (pp. 35-6).

This is not to criticize Hanley for writing the book he wrote rather than some other book. He has good reasons for his selection of Hume, Rousseau, Smith, and Kant as his subjects: "the simple stature and influence of these four thinkers and concepts," the fact that these are the four that "continue to be invoked in contemporary debate" (p. 18), the depth and breadth of their accounts of other-directedness, and the way those accounts are "central and indeed foundational to their larger moral and political systems" (p. 18).

My suggestion is not that Hanley should have considered the views of other philosophers, but rather that he might be overstating the revolutionary nature of the views of these four. They did not quite "invent" (p. 19) the idea of secular sentimental other-directedness; their views should probably be viewed not so much as a "revolutionary reconsideration" (p. 5) as a gradual evolution that took shape in the works of both male and female philosophers of the preceding century.


Broad, Jacqueline. The Philosophy of Mary Astell; An Early Modern Theory of Virtue. Oxford University Press, 2015.

Conway, Anne. The Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy. Translated and edited by Allison P. Coudert and Taylor Corse. Cambridge University Press, 1996.

Masham, Damaris. A Discourse Concerning the Love of God. London: Printed for Awnsham and John Churchil, 1696.