Machiavelli on Liberty and Conflict

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David Johnston, Nadia Urbinati, and Camila Vergara (eds.), Machiavelli on Liberty and Conflict, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 423pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226429304.

Reviewed by Kenneth Winston, Harvard University


This volume originated at a conference in 2013 at Columbia University to celebrate the 500th anniversary of The Prince. It was an opportune occasion, as the editors note, to examine the foundations, meaning, and legacy of Machiavelli's thought. The result is an engaging, insightful collection of sixteen essays by scholars from Australia, England, France, Italy, and the United States presenting contemporary lines of research and interpretation. In subject matter, they range widely: from small-scale readings of selected texts, to historical and contextual studies of leading ideas, to assessments of Machiavelli's continuing influence.

The editors have divided the essays into four sections: on Machiavelli's relation to previous, especially ancient, political thinkers; Machiavelli's political realism and moral provocations; the features and problems of republican polities; and Machiavelli's influence as reflected in a few 20th century thinkers. However, the essays overflow or elude these categories, as one would expect in dealing with a thinker as complex -- and elusive -- as Machiavelli.

I should emphasize that I approach this collection not as a scholar of Machiavelli but as a long-time teacher of practical ethics to mid-career practitioners, including government officials and other laborers in the public sector. Practitioners discover that Machiavelli speaks directly and candidly to their professional preoccupations and concerns. With his resistance to philosophical system, they appreciate his genius in uncovering truths about ethics and power which otherwise remain concealed in the idealizations of most theorists. He grasps their experience and speaks credibly about it. Because of that, they are eager to ponder (even if not necessarily follow) his advice.

Why does Machiavelli speak so powerfully to people of experience? In the first instance, it is because of his down-to-earth treatment of moral conundrums and the well-known (albeit controversial) teaching that a good person is not necessarily a good leader -- leadership requires skills that a good person may lack. And, conversely, that a good leader is not necessarily a good person -- the goodness that forms an integral part of good leadership gets its content from the leader's public responsibilities, which set it apart from, and sometimes in conflict with, personal beliefs and aspirations.

Equally important is Machiavelli's message that practical moral thinking is strategic. By this I mean that pursuit of the public good is contingent on available resources and the authority to act. It recognizes the recalcitrance of the world, including the difficulty of aligning interests with the public good, as well as the role of fortune and thus the importance of opportunism in the pursuit of moral ends. It is also as much about appearances and communication (persuasion and the arts of oratory) as about substance. As a result, the good practitioner is someone with the requisite competence to act effectively for the public good in circumstances that are conflictual, fleeting, and partially out of control. Hence the importance of Machiavelli's focus on the qualities of the good leader, especially the virtue of prudence. These themes speak powerfully to practitioners.

Although written by academics, the essays touch on these themes in various ways. I will briefly discuss the essays -- I do not have space for all of them -- that address three related issues: the autonomy of politics from ethics, the problem of dirty hands, and conflict in political society.

[1] The (possible) autonomy of politics from ethics is a thread that runs through many of the essays. In an elegant bit of textual analysis, Erica Benner observes what she regards as a kind of ambivalence in Machiavelli's realism, based on different perceptions of human nature. In one set of passages (reflecting the conventional view of Machiavelli), human beings are so universally untrustworthy that rulers are required to adopt a purely instrumental posture toward morality and thus believe they are justified in committing evil deeds as necessary. In other passages, however, a different kind of realism shows through. Benner sees Machiavelli displaying more confidence in the human capacity to develop relations of trust and collaboration, which are critical for good governance and require a non-instrumental view. This is a persuasive riff on the adage that the best way to appear to be good is to be good; it holds out the possibility of a benign reading in which politics and ethics are fully integrated. Benner's second kind of realism is only suggestive, however, and takes for granted the conventional reading of Machiavelli as an amoral theorist.

The conventional view is shared by Harvey C. Mansfield and Paul A. Rahe, in their contributions, but most of the authors in this collection adhere to a humanist reading of Machiavelli as a moralist grappling with some of the complexities (not to say, dark corners) of common morality. Curiously, no one observes that the issue of autonomy from ethics arises in every major profession; it is not peculiar to politics. Although the scale is different, every profession develops a distinctive code of conduct and poses the question whether, in cases of conflict, its practitioners are exempt from common morality. What is it about professional (or public) life that generates this idea? It is easy to see that practitioners take on new responsibilities and new duties. Do they, thereby, have permission -- conferred by a special ethic -- to engage in acts that would be immoral if performed by someone else?

Quentin Skinner's essay is helpful here, although it does not provide a full answer. He observes that Machiavelli's account of the princely virtues builds on the work of classical Roman moralists and draws the same distinction they draw between personal virtues (such as charity and piety) and political virtues (liberality, clemency, good faith). The latter are distinct in being qualities that contribute to prudent conduct in public affairs. What Skinner adds is that, when Machiavelli contends that rulers sometimes must act in defiance of the virtues (that is, immorally), it is the personal virtues that Machiavelli sees as obstacles, not the political virtues. (Thus, the good leader is not necessarily a good person.) In a corrupt world, Machiavelli says, people are confused sometimes about what these virtues require or are thought to prescribe. The prudent ruler is skilled in discerning what is or is not consistent with political virtue.

This is important because it highlights Machiavelli's awareness of how personal and political virtue can diverge and conflict, illustrating the disorderly character of moral life in our non-ideal world. When scholars focus on Machiavelli's instruction about consciously committing evil (when necessary), they typically fail to notice this disorderliness and thus the numerous -- and perfectly cogent -- ways ethical conflicts can arise. They treat morality as a clear, uniform, unproblematic set of requirements, without recognizing that its personal, professional, conventional, and aspirational dimensions produce constant instability and test the limits of human powers. In such a world, even the most conscientious person can face intractable problems.

[2] An inevitable outcome of this moral fragmentation is the problem of dirty hands, which practitioners frequently encounter -- or believe they encounter -- in their daily work. (It is because of the widespread belief that it is so important to work through the problem with an astute observer like Machiavelli.) The term dirty hands, briefly, refers to situations in which it appears that the morally better course of action is to do something morally wrong. Which, of course, is paradoxical: how can it be morally better to do something morally wrong?

Reading Machiavelli through the lens of Max Weber, Giovanni Giorgini observes that Machiavelli did not advocate a new morality and did not believe that politicians enjoy a special dispensation from common morality. Thus, implicitly, he rejects a special ethic. Rather, politicians sometimes confront tragic dilemmas, which are part of common morality. But what are tragic dilemmas? Giorgini observes that, while the existence of true dilemmas has no place in Christian thought, they were effectively portrayed in Greek tragedy and Machiavelli learned from them. But how are we to understand dilemmas today? Giorgini notes that Machiavelli never says the end justifies the means, but how then are we to understand Machiavelli's teaching on committing evil? Even if Giorgini is right, as I believe he is, it is only the beginning of discussion.

Here as elsewhere, constructive interpretation of Machiavelli would be aided by contemporary work on practical ethics, but such references are missing from these essays. An extensive literature on moral dilemmas exists: why they arise, how to frame the problem, what solutions do or do not make sense. (I have in mind the writings of Thomas Nagel, Bernard Williams, Martha Nussbaum, David Luban, and others.) This work offers conceptual distinctions, frameworks, forms of practical argumentation that would be helpful in reading classic texts. Consistent with her benign reading of Machiavelli, Benner sees his appeal to necessity, not as an invitation to moral deviation, but as an occasion for exercising imagination and devising alternative (moral) courses of action. Benner seems to acknowledge that this is a bit wistful; at any rate, it strikes me as an evasion. Benner insists on the difficulty of coming up with plausible instances of unavoidable wrongdoing, but she does not discuss any of the standard cases in the literature. Meanwhile, she misses the nuance in Machiavelli's famous discussion in Discourses I.9 of Romulus killing Remus, where he consistently uses the language of excuse, not justification.

Stephen Holmes employs Benner's two kinds of realism to argue that the prudent ruler, recognizing the need to maintain the loyalty of subjects in times of adversity, will have the foresight to invest in institutions and policies that incline citizens to offer support in a crisis. This includes the rule of law, respect for personal property, and avoidance, so far as possible, of a politics of fear and cruelty. In a clever rhetorical inversion, Holmes suggests that, to maintain such loyalty, the prudent ruler is "forced to be good." This phrase neatly captures Benner's hopeful reading of Machiavelli, but it reflects the same dichotomous choice: either Machiavelli is completely amoral, or he is unproblematically moral.

[3] The problem of dirty hands is perhaps the most obvious manifestation of fragmentation and conflict in moral life. But Machiavelli goes a step further in his discussion of ideal polities by stressing the virtue of social conflict for preserving liberty. Many of the essays touch on this topic in one way or another, and I learned more from them than from any of the others. In one formulation, the central question is whether conflict or harmony is the preferred political ideal, or in more contemporary terms, is Machiavelli best understood as a republican or as a democratic theorist? Jean-Fabien Spitz and John P. McCormick argue against the republican reading, largely because it is less useful, they believe, as a resource for reinvigorating contemporary democracies.

McCormick's pro-democracy interpretation is well known from his book Machiavellian Democracy; here he extends it to his reading of Machiavelli's Florentine Histories. Spitz offers a more direct argument, targeting in particular the republican reading of Machiavelli promoted by Skinner and Philip Pettit (who is not included in this collection). These authors, Spitz says, "fear majority rule much more than elitist domination" and favor institutional mechanisms "that are meant to prevent political conflicts (something Machiavelli was not afraid of) but that, in fact, tend to enhance the power of experts over the power of the people." When it is claimed that the popolo and the grandi share an interest in order, stability, and predictability, that opens the door to the rhetoric of harmony, which is a cover for elite domination. Machiavelli's view, rather, is that the desire to dominate is less decent than the desire not to be dominated. Because of the natural emergence of both desires (in different classes), the latter -- and its expression in political conflict -- is crucial to maintaining liberty and a well-ordered state.

It is important to stress that Machiavelli praises only a regulated kind of civic conflict, as may occur in a well-ordered republic, that is, where there are good laws and properly functioning institutions. Both Benedetto Fontana and Luca Baccelli, in separate essays, distinguish two kinds of conflict, which Fontana refers to as positive and negative and Baccelli as healthy and pathological. The first is conducive to a republic's viability and resilience; it enlarges citizenship and enhances freedom. The second is exemplified by the kind of factionalism that destabilizes a republic, especially divisiveness generated by conflicts over wealth and property among elites. Jérémie Barthas adds to this analysis in his essay by focusing on Machiavelli's sustained argument, while in office as well as in his writings, against the use of mercenary armies and in favor of "people in arms," which shifts power away from aristocratic and toward democratic elements. Barthas elaborates Machiavelli's insights about public debt and the financial system generally as key mechanisms by which the aristocratic "military-financial complex" exercises its influence.

In an interesting aside on this theme, Gabriele Pedullà argues that, in using Rome as a model of the good polity, Machiavelli attempted to counter the widespread criticism of Rome in the humanist literature of the 14th and 15th centuries, which favored princely rule over the tumultuous Roman republic, and the tendency in contemporary public discourse to blur the boundaries between Rome and Venice as possible exemplars. Machiavelli sharpens the distinction between Venice and Rome by emphasizing the former's preference for aristocratic dominance and commitment to harmony among social classes as against the latter's more fractious -- but liberty-preserving -- constitution. The tendency of later historians to accept the sharp distinction between Venice and Rome, Pedullà says, shows Machiavelli's success in shaping our thinking about his time.

I suppose Machiavelli's stance on conflict is troubling to theorists who are inclined to resist the idea that permanent social antagonism is a virtue. But, while Machiavelli does place great emphasis on constitutionalism and the rule of law in a well-ordered republic, he does not lose sight of the inevitable tendencies toward oligarchic control and corruption which generate a need for continual vigilance and even insurgency. As Marie Gaille observes in the final essay, this point was stressed in the 20th century by Louis Althusser: democratic citizens express their moral agency precisely by inscribing a resistance to institutionalization.

The extended attention to social conflict in democratic polities is especially salient given our current political crisis. On this topic, as with Machiavelli's teaching on morality, the essays in this collection are valuable in forcing us to deal with intrinsic features of the non-ideal world we live in, however disorderly and disagreeable. In the pursuit of ideals, what matters to practitioners is that the ideals are realistic, and the pursuit is informed by knowledge of the conditions under which they are likely to be fulfilled or frustrated. This is the quality that gives to Machiavelli's work its enduring significance.