Machiavelli's Politics

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Catherine H. Zuckert, Machiavelli's Politics, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 477pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226434803.

Reviewed by Cary J. Nederman, Texas A&M University


Catherine Zuckert is among the leading historians of Western political thought, her scholarship over the years covering an impressive range of topics and epochs, from Plato to American political philosophy, not to mention exposition of the ideas of the influential German-American philosopher Leo Strauss. And, of course, as this book attests, she has contributed significantly to the study of Niccolò Machiavelli, the famous (and, for some, notorious) sixteenth-century political author, the mention of whose very name often elicits a quite visceral reaction from a surprisingly broad audience. The volume under review represents the fruits of Zuckert's considerable reflections on Machiavelli's writings, containing both previously published and unpublished material.

As an alert to the reader, it is important to signal that Zuckert and I come to the reading of Machiavelli from fundamentally different perspectives. She subscribes to the Straussian school of hermeneutics (although I do not wish to imply the existence of a single "core" element of Straussianism), while I do not. It is unsurprising, then, that the fingerprints of Strauss and his acolytes are all over the book. Regardless of our divergent approaches, however, I still think it a useful exercise to discuss the book's merits and weaknesses without any need to refer to what are probably intractable disputes over issues of method. This caveat acknowledged, I propose to examine Zuckert's book in precisely the same fashion in which I read Machiavelli (or indeed any other political theorist) -- namely, at face value -- rather than seeking "secret" or otherwise obscure messages in her writing (10).

As to the vision of Zuckert's project, she is not shy about stating from the outset that her aim in this very substantial tome is nothing short of settling some of the largest interpretive quandaries that pervade Machiavelli scholarship and have done so for generations. The primary, and certainly most vexing, problem pertains to the coherence of his quite diverse and sizeable œuvre. Zuckert's solution, simply stated, is two-pronged. First, she locates in Machiavelli a systematic set of related methods. One, in his prose works, she terms "dialectical," in the sense that Machiavelli alternates between different viewpoints, critiquing them sequentially; the other, in his literary writings, involves his creation of oppositional characters who have differing insights into "what is important and what works" (23).

The first part of the book (41-275) constitutes a close, section-by-section reading of, if not quite a commentary on, what she terms "Machiavelli's Comprehensive Writings," that is, the Prince and the Discourses. (The former, of course, offered advice about how rulers needed to behave to acquire and remain in power, while the latter was a spirited defense of republican government, especially as manifested in ancient Rome.) This initial component concludes with Zuckert's effort to articulate the unifying features of those texts (as discussed below). The second part, entitled "Later Developments," focuses on Machiavelli's plays, as well as his treatise on warfare and his historical writings, in order to fill out the qualities she has identified in his classic prose works. By way of an aside, I thank Zuckert for rescuing these so-called "lesser" texts from the (undeserved) obscurity that has resulted from a prominent line of scholarship that holds that all of value in Machiavelli's political theory may be found solely in his two "major" works. I do wish, however, that she had delved further into his verse (much of which has philosophical import, such as L'asino) and some of his more self-reflective letters, such as one addressed to Gian Battisa Soderini that has come to be known as the Ghiribizzi.

The second element that Zuckert postulates as unifying the wide range of Machiavelli's compositions relates to the substance of his project. As the title of the volume indicates, she foregrounds his intellectual cohesion in terms of "politics," rather than, say, philosophy. But her conception of "politics" is extremely specific or, depending upon one's point of view, extremely vague. Machiavelli's thought has commonly been contextualized in relation to the circumstances of Italy generally, and of Florence particularly, during the late fifteenth and early sixteenth centuries. He was, after all, deeply embedded in that milieu, serving in the Florentine republican government for many years. Once the Medici family reasserted its control over the city, he was booted from office, underwent torture, and was eventually forced into a form of internal exile. It was under these circumstances that he composed the Prince (usually dated to around 1512-1514) and Discourses (c.1514-1519). But for Zuckert, the "politics" of Machiavelli has an entirely different connotation. On her account, the meaning of Machiavellian "politics" entails a fundamentally educative function, not for fellow citizens "in his immediate context, but most importantly in order to improve human life in the future" (24). In other words, Machiavelli's intended primary readership was an imaginary audience open to instruction about the foibles and potential pitfalls of an essentially universal condition, namely, the realm of the political that, for Zuckert, is hypostatized and reified for all time. In other words, if I understand her correctly, those of us today who approach Machiavelli's body of work can learn just as much, if not more, than could his contemporaries.

In my view, this is a hard claim to demonstrate convincingly, in spite of Zuckert's mighty efforts. But let us for a moment take her at her word. We may legitimately ask about the "core" of Machiavelli's political lesson. The response to this query is complicated, but I think that I am able to perceive one strand. For Zuckert, Machiavelli teaches a sort of chastened populism (in contrast to some recent scholars who have found in him powerful democratic resources). The statement of her interpretation merits direct quotation:

Machiavelli's arguments in both books [viz., the Prince and the Discourses] are designed to persuade those who possess or seek to possess political power that the first and foremost goal of government is and must remain the security of the people. . . the first requirement of government was seen to be the education of such future rulers -- for the good of all. (274)

If this is, at any rate, a portion of the teaching that Machiavelli imparts to his readers today, it seems a very odd one. By that, I mean to point out how basic political realities have been crucially transformed between his time and ours. In an article by fellow Straussian Harvey Mansfield, "Machiavelli's Stato and the Impersonal Modern State" (which I do not find cited in this book), a quite convincing argument is proposed that the conception of governance on the basis of which the Florentine constructed his theories was fundamentally pre-modern in orientation, in the sense that it depended upon the preceding medieval view that the nature of rulership was inseparable from the personal character and mores of the ruler himself. Once ideas and practices of sovereignty and constitutionalism become prevalent, such a personalized conception of government passed into irrelevance. To the extent that Mansfield's position is correct -- and on this point, I strongly agree -- the insight that Machiavelli is supposed to have imparted for the ages was rendered obsolete within a century or so after his lifetime. Even if Machiavelli sought, as Zuckert asserts, to write for the ages, he must of needs fail miserably because of significant changes in the fundamental assumptions upon which the edifice of politics was constructed, changes that he could not reasonably have foreseen. Sorry, Niccolò.

A further observation about the substance of this book is worthy of mention. One of Machiavelli's key concepts throughout his corpus is fortune (Fortuna), which he plays off against another of his main constructs, virtù. Given the centrality of Fortuna to his thought, Zuckert has remarkably little to say about the topic. Yet, there is virtually no part of Machiavelli's corpus that does not include reference to the power of Fortuna, the goddess of earthly change. Human beings are victims of fortune; and fortune itself is generally malignant, at least in the long run. Essential to Machiavellian thought is the contention that any ruler who counts on fortune alone to support his decisions and policies will, in the course of events, inevitably be disappointed, and eventually destroyed.

At the same time, another dimension to Machiavelli's thought cuts in a different direction, namely, his idea that some human beings at least are capable of acquiring a certain set of qualities that permit them a wide latitude in controlling their circumstances and conquering fortune. Virtù is the word that Machiavelli employs to capture and summarize these characteristics. While Zuckert has a great deal to say about virtù, she offers only one extended discussion of Fortuna (97-107), and does not correlate the latter with the former. This strikes me as a rather odd maneuver, certainly one that requires some attention, given the fact that there has been a great deal of scholarship on the topic (and a wide range of disagreement). It is my belief that there are intellectual consequences to her strategy, such as understanding the significance of Chapter 26 of the Prince, which addresses specifically the potential for imperial expansion on the part of the Medici.

No review-length analysis of a volume of the breadth and depth of Zuckert's could ever adequately capture the full extent of her accomplishment. So, the foregoing remarks must suffice. But permit me to note a few flaws of a more technical nature. I found the absence of a bibliography, especially in a book this long, to be an annoyance. Zuckert tries to make up for this lacuna with a comprehensive index, but the result is hardly the same. I was surprised that, while Zuckert engages the French-, German- and (especially) English-language secondary literature fairly thoroughly, she is less attentive to the massive body of Machiavelli scholarship written in Italian (to which, by my count, there are only 14 citations). I fully realize that mastery of the entirety of the scholarly corpus treating Machiavelli is beyond any reasonable expectation, but there are so many important books and articles written in Italian that I was disappointed with the paucity of her encounter with them. Although Zuckert cites Sebastian de Graza's award-winning book Machiavelli in Hell once (360 note 47), neither his name nor the title of his book are included in the index (hence, another good reason for a bibliography). She thoroughly mischaracterizes Mary Dietz's famous argument in her article "Trapping the Prince" as one in a long line that regarded the Prince as "satire" (14). Indeed, Dietz's point is quite the opposite.

All of my qualms aside, I have no doubt that Machiavelli's Politics will enter into canon of academic studies of its subject. It affords its readers a new path into the intellectual terrain of the world of Machiavelli. (And that is saying a great deal at a time when so many books and articles on the Florentine litter libraries and academic journals.) As such, Zuckert's contribution bodes well indeed for continuing interest in a thinker who has been nearly five centuries in his grave.