Make/Believing the World(s): Toward a Christian Ontological Pluralism

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Mark S. McLeod-Harrison, Make/Believing the World(s): Toward a Christian Ontological Pluralism, McGill-Queen's UP, 2009, 386pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780773535930.

Reviewed by Cristian F. Mihut, Bethel College



McLeod-Harrison articulates a surprising view that combines cognitive irrealism, ontological pluralism, and aspects of orthodox Christian doctrine. The ontological pluralism he defends (to be distinguished from the view in metaontology) is indebted to Nelson Goodman’s view that human noetic feats shape the actual World in plural, incompatible ways. One might expect this position to be attended by some of the usual suspects: nominalism about properties, a deflationary theory of truth, extensionalism about possible worlds, and the concept of “God” as at best a Feuerbachian projection or cultural make-belief. But that’s not what we get. Following Michael Lynch, McLeod-Harrison endorses a realist account of truth. His version of pluralism relies on Platonism about properties (especially those of truth and existence) combined with modal actualism (ersatz modal realism) about possible worlds. Most startling perhaps is the theological motivation for this position. Evoking the naming of animals in the Garden of Eden, McLeod-Harrison argues that humans carve new worlds because God endows them with creative powers analogous to or continuous with his. Even though God’s core does not depend on human conceptual reaching, still “God is embedded in God’s conceptual scheme(s) and therefore does not escape ”SpellE">noetic dependence" (5).

The book is divided into four main sections. The first section introduces, among other things, two seminal sets of distinctions, noetic realism/irrealism on the one hand, and alethic realism/irrealism on the other. A noetic irrealist holds, while the noetic realist denies, that human cognizings (conceptualizing, believing, knowing, emoting, gesticulating etc.) contribute causally to the ways the World is. An alethic realist affirms, while the alethic irrealist denies, “that a truth-bearer is true when things are as the truth-value bearer says they are” (26). The ontological pluralism under consideration combines noetic irrealism with alethic realism. Humans cannot create ex nihilo; rather, through their cognitive feats they carve worlds out of “the ”SpellE">noumenal material" of a mind-independent World created and sustained by the noetic activity of God (31).

A main focus in section two is to flesh out a compelling response to the consistency dilemma. This is the challenge. If pluralism is right, two distinct metaphysical perspectives could provide equally true yet mutually incompatible descriptions of reality. To avoid embracing contradictions, the pluralist relativizes the two descriptions to different conceptual frameworks. Suitably relativized to conceptual schemes, these perspectives can be lined up side by side without contradiction. But now, all true descriptions either describe the same absolute aspects of the World in different languages, or they pick out different aspects of the world such that the conjunction of perspectives yields an absolute account of the World. Either way, there is no reason to deny that there is only one way the World is. So, pluralism seems unmotivated.

The strategy for responding here is heavily indebted to Michael Lynch. The core insight is that the pluralist must draw a distinction between thin and thick metaphysical concepts (truth, existence, object, etc.). For instance, a thin or minimal concept of object is shared across conceptual schemes, but then is filled out, enriched, or thickened differently in different worlds (Aristotle fills in the concept of an object as a discrete entity, whereas Whitehead fills it in as a momentary event). More generally, descriptions containing metaphysically thickened concepts could wind up mutually incompatible relative to each conceptual scheme, while also overlapping in light of their shared minimal contents. Following Lynch, McLeod-Harrison argues that commitment to the minimal concept of truth requires accepting truth as a thinly realistic property. But unlike Lynch, he extends this to the concept of existence:

Were existence a thin property and hence fluid enough to be filled out robustly in different worlds, pluralism would still work. After all, if truth is a property and can be thinly taken in general but thickly filled out in different worlds, I don’t see why existence can’t be just as well. And if existence, then surely objects also. (105)

The pluralist irrealist seems happy to embrace Platonic realism about properties, if these properties are general or thin enough. But the irrealist also insists that humans creatively crystallize or thicken these concepts, creating through their noetic work different world-versions.

The third part motivates and provides a substantial positive explication of a Kantian inspired pluralistic irrealism. I take the following to be the main claims of this section: (1) Pluralism is motivated by the intractability of metaphysical debates, and this in turn is due to the nature of the metaphysical concepts themselves. (2) Epistemic commitments are explained by the ways we have already conceptualized the world and not the other way around. (3) Our experience of the world is already conceptually shaped. (4) But our concepts are worldly shaped as well, for the contents of our beliefs are just chunks of the world. (5) Our paradigmatic noetic engagement with the worlds is not representation but presentation: we aim to rightly render the worlds not only alethically, but also aesthetically and morally. (6) God fixes the limits and coherence for what counts as rightly rendered worlds.

This is a rich but also challenging account. I will only comment on a couple of its features. Support for claim (3) rests on John McDowell’s view that our passive, empirical concepts are always embedded in a large network of reasons. As such, the work of free spontaneous thinking is always involved in shaping our perceptions. Furthermore, on McDowell’s view, the complex sets of conceptual lenses that codify our experiences of the world are themselves historical, shaped by the free activity of the human mind. McLeod-Harrison charges that the complex capacity for meaning-making must be explained ultimately by God, or else the irrealist position collapses into an untenable idealism. If the World depends crucially on noetic contributions, then if there were no humans, we would have no World. But I don’t think this has to show, as McLeod-Harrison claims, that “Any ”SpellE">Bildung we have is rooted, ultimately, in God’s creative activity" (153).

To be fair, McLeod-Harrison considers the possibility that the capacity for meaning-making has evolved, or as he puts it, that we “have simply moved from bald nature (bits of organic matter) to thoughtful, reasonable humans with a ”SpellE">Bildung" (217). This possibility, however, is dismissed in a rather facile fashion. He claims that our “cultural education and history started somewhere and that … remains the central mystery of philosophy to which theology — and for my money, particularly Christian theology — provides a most cogent answer” (217). A more robust strategy here is to give an argument to the best explanation. For on the one hand, the evolutionary hypothesis appears to be at least as simple, coherent, fruitful and empirically adequate as the theistic explanation. If these aren’t helpful criteria, then at least we need motivations and specifications for other criteria that do the trick. On the other hand, grounding human capacity for meaning-making in God appears equally mysterious. To some it seems nothing short of puzzling that a self-sufficient, resplendent, infinite triune being should create finite beings that have the ability to create. So, it seems, we need reasons to prefer one mystery to another.

This sort of objection generalizes to other parts of McLeod-Harrison’s argument. For instance in support of (6) above he claims that the law of non-contradiction has to hold in all conceptual worlds in order to provide coherence and unification for human noetic exertions in each world. The law of non-contradiction could not be a fact in a superworld, on pain of an infinite regress. So, God’s own being grounds the law of non-contradiction, and more generally affords the unification needed across worlds. Yet it seems that the universality desired for unification would also obtain on the hypothesis that the law of non-contradiction is a constitutive feature of our psychology. Furthermore, reasons are needed to show that the Trinitarian God’s specific way of grounding the law is not any more perplexing than the available alternatives, be they transcendent, transcendental, or naturalistic.

As McLeod-Harrison recognizes, his worldly content theory of belief (4 above) will raise suspicion. As I’ve mentioned, his irrealism implies that the world is constituted by noetic material. So, although the truth-maker (on the World side) and truth-bearer (on the mind side) are so close as to be “merging,” he still wants to maintain the distinction. Beliefs and not propositions are the primary truth-bearers, whereas propositions are to be understood as concrete bits of the World. So, propositions being the content of beliefs do not represent the world. They are identical with it, or bits of it. None of this implies that beliefs constitute the world. McLeod-Harrison draws the distinction between act-beliefs and content-beliefs. To illustrate, that the snow is white just is the fact that the snow is white: “Snow’s being white is not an abstract entity but a concrete bit of the World” (174). To believe that the snow is white is to take a certain mental attitude toward a bit of the world. He elaborates:

The thinkable isn’t independent of the World — it is the World. The only thing independent of the World is the believing (the mental action) … What is clearly mental is the attitude one takes toward the World - in this case, the act-belief. It is only the mental that has actual content. The proposition or the thinkable just is a bit of the world itself and cannot, as such, have content. (174)

Furthermore, the distinction between generative truth and statement truth tracks the distinction between act-belief and content-belief. When I get things right in my attitudes, my actbelievings, I thereby generate facts, since facts just are true propositions. This connection is forged “through concepts, construction of a world, experience of that world, and ”SpellE">believings that grow within a world" (179).

An interesting illustration of how act-believing enriches a world involves a father who chooses to “go along” with his son’s observation as they both watch a bar of soap floating in the bath water. “That is a great boat,” says the son. On McLeod-Harrison’s analysis, the father’s

act-belief changed, which changed the ontology of the world, which changed the object of belief ’that’s a bar of soap’ into a false one (an empty bit of the world) and a previously false belief ’that’s a great boat’ into a true one. (186)

But now consider an alternative analysis of the mental act in this case, which does not require a change in ontology and which relies on standard psychological assumptions about the interaction between adults and children. Suppose the father forms the thought “that is a great boat,” but on analysis what he truly believes is: “that is a soap which on this particular occasion functions as a boat”. Some such translation seems to me more natural, and has the upshot of not requiring a change in ontology.

Many more questions could be asked about McLeod-Harrison’s worldly content theory of truth. Are all propositions concrete bits of the world? What about propositions about mathematics, modality and God? Since act-beliefs are truth-bearers, can other mental attitudes such as wishing, desiring, fearing, lusting be true or false? If yes, how so? If not, what principled reason keeps them out, since it’s clear that at least some of these have propositions as contents?

The fourth and last section provides a stimulating and nonconformist account of the Christian God’s involvement with the World. I appreciate the commitment to the creeds, and the emphasis on orthodoxy as a living thing (225). The account of God’s ways of being as the objective standard for rightness of rendering (alethic, aesthetic, and moral) for the worlds is a welcome challenge to the narrow focus on the intellectualist models of God. His articulation of the Trinity betrays a poetic and pastoral sensitivity, the discussion of metaphorical language about God is both sharp and profound, and his defense of a theology of history is timely.

But the account will also raise some eyebrows. Some will wonder just how it is that the being of the Triune God grounds all possibilia and the principle of non-contradiction, if God has no beliefs (312). It’s true that McLeod-Harrison claims God must have thoughts. But how can God provide for the coherence of all noetic worlds without cognitive items that play the functional role of belief? Some will worry that the account implies a radical responsiveness on God’s part to the vagaries and “stupidities” of human choices that impinges on God’s providence. And some will worry about the doctrine of physical creation. For, if the account is right, and “the actual world is itself a set of God’s thoughts,” it’s hard to see how we can believe literally that God created a physical body, or that he inhabited one (274).