Making Things Happen: a Theory of Causal Explanation

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Woodward, James, Making Things Happen: a Theory of Causal Explanation, Oxford, 2003, 418pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195155270.

Reviewed by Henk W. de Regt, Vrije Universiteit Amsterdam


This book addresses two related issues that are central in contemporary philosophy of science: causation and explanation. Its author, James Woodward, has been working and publishing on these topics for at least twenty-five years: his first paper on scientific explanation dates from 1979. The present book is the culmination of a long-term research effort and the crown on a long series of publications. The view defended in this book is elegantly captured in the title: according to Woodward it is the possibility of intervention and manipulation that is essential to causation and explanation. Making Things Happen contains an elaborate presentation and defense of Woodward’s ‘manipulability theory’ of causation and causal explanation, a powerful alternative to extant theories in the field. After an introductory chapter containing a summary of the central theses and some methodological reflections, Woodward’s theory of causation is unfolded in two long chapters, which form the basis of the book. Three chapters are devoted to explanation; they present Woodward’s theory and compare it with rival accounts. In addition, there is a chapter on the notion of invariance and one that applies the theory to regression analysis used in the biomedical and social sciences. The book contains an enormous wealth of ideas and detailed arguments. In this review I will focus on the two central topics, respectively causation and explanation.


If one hits a piano key, one usually hears a sound. While it may seem obvious that hitting the key (H) causes the sound (S), there is disagreement among philosophers about the content of this claim. On the so-called regularity theory of causation, ascribed to Hume and espoused by empiricists such as Carnap and Quine, ‘H causes S’ merely asserts the regular succession of hitting piano keys and hearing sounds. On Salmon’s and Dowe’s process theory, by contrast, ‘H causes S’ implies the existence of particular processes and interactions: mechanical energy is transferred from finger to hammer, then to a string, then via the surrounding air to the ear, where it is perceived as a musical sound. On Lewis’s counterfactual theory, causal claims reflect counterfactual dependencies: ‘H causes S’ means that there is a chain of counterfactually dependent events between H and S (if the key had not been hit, or the hammer had not been set into motion, etc., no sound would have resulted). On the so-called agency theory of causation, defended by von Wright and more recently by Menzies and Price, ‘H causes S’ means that a free agent can bring about a musical sound by hitting the piano key. All these views reflect particular intuitions one might have with respect to causation.

Woodward presents a new theory of causation that he claims to be superior to the above-mentioned accounts. On this theory, a causal relation is a relation between variables (e.g. H, S) that can take on different values (e.g. either hitting or not hitting the key, or differing degrees of hitting), and H causes S if and only if the value of S would change under some intervention on H. For example, if a desperado would have entered the saloon and shot the pianist, thus preventing him from hitting the key, no sound would have been produced by the piano. Or, if the pianist would have hit the key somewhat stronger, a somewhat louder sound would have resulted. In Chapter 2 this analysis of causation is spelt out in detail. After having presented the tools for analyzing causal relationships (graphs and equations), Woodward formulates his manipulability theory (henceforth: MT) in the form of a criterion that specifies necessary and sufficient conditions for X to be a cause of Y (with respect to a set of variables V). The idea of intervention, which is characterized more precisely in Chapter 3, is crucial here, because interventions allow us to change X while holding other variables constant, thus determining its contributing effect on Y. This has three important implications. First, it relates causation to manipulation. Indeed, MT is motivated by the intuition that the use of the concept of causation is rooted in the practical values of manipulation and control. Yet the notion of intervention is defined without reference to free human action, and MT thereby evades anthropomorphism. Woodward regards this as an advantage, as it allows for an objective theory of causation; it is here that he departs from existing agency theories of causation, that are explicitly anthropomorphic. Second, it relates causation to experimentation: causal relations are determined by manipulating a putative cause (by intervention) in order to see whether there are changes in the effect, a procedure that is tantamount to experimentation. Such experiments do not have to be actual or real: they are typically hypothetical experiments that do not even have to be realizable in practice. Third, it relates causation to counterfactuals: MT refers to what would happen in case of counterfactual interventions. In this respect it is related to Lewis’s theory, but Woodward argues that MT is preferable for various reasons. For example, on Lewis’s theory causal judgments are ultimately based on abstract standards of similarity between possible worlds, while on MT they are grounded in concrete assessments of possibilities for manipulation and control. The latter basis is far more plausible than the former when it comes to causal reasoning of ordinary people in daily practice.

Woodward’s approach is continuous with recent work on causal modeling in the social and biomedical sciences, in particular by Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines (1993) and Pearl (2000). While these authors present detailed methodologies, Woodward is mainly concerned with the philosophical foundations of such causal reasoning. Still, he does stay in touch with scientific practice (and with daily practice as well) and chooses his examples accordingly. This is laudable – the book does not only contain the artificial, contrived examples one often encounters in texts about causation and explanation. As a typical example from scientific practice Woodward cites the case of determining the relation between administration of a particular drug to a patient and his recovery from a particular disease. Medical scientists have a standard method for finding this out: the double blind testing procedure. One group of patients is given the drug, while another (control) group is supplied with a placebo, holding all other circumstances equal (as far as possible), and it is observed whether or not a statistically significant difference in recovery results between the two groups of patients. On Woodward’s account, this amounts to an experiment in which the experimenter intervenes by manipulating the cause (changing the intervention variable, which has two values: treated/untreated) and observing whether an effect results (change of the two-valued variable recovery/nonrecovery).

MT has great initial plausibility because it is based on common sense intuitions regarding manipulation and control. However, Woodward’s generalization of these intuitions is not as unproblematic as might seem at first sight. According to MT, the assertion of a causal relationship between X and Y involves the counterfactual claim that (indefinite) repeated intervention on X would lead to a change of Y, even in cases where such interventions are physically impossible (p. 71). This assumption is acceptable if MT is intended as specifying the meaning of causal claims, but not if it is meant as a theory of causal inference or testing. Indeed, this is how Woodward defends his answer to the question ‘In what sense must interventions be possible?’ (Section 3.5, see esp. p. 130). So far so good. But if MT is a theory of the meaning of causal claims, a new problem arises, related to its nonreductive nature. MT does not reduce causation to other concepts, because causal relations are defined via the notion of intervention, which is itself a causal notion. Woodward argues that this circularity is not vicious because the causal information required to characterize the intervention is independent of the alleged causal relation between X and Y (p.104). However, this argument holds water only if MT is regarded as a theory of causal inference or testing. If MT is a theory of the meaning of causal claims, then it is hard to see how the circularity cannot be vicious.


Scientific explanation has been a topic of debate and controversy since the end of the 1950s, when Hempel’s deductive-nomological (DN) model of explanation came under attack. One of its earliest critics, Michael Scriven, argued that causal stories can be explanatory without conforming to the DN model. An example, cited by Scriven, is the explanation of the tipping over of an ink bottle by telling a story of how somebody’s knee hits the table causing the bottle to fall. This account does not conform to the DN model because it does not contain laws on which to base a deductive argument. Woodward’s approach to explanation is guided by the intuition that Scriven’s example is a genuine case of explanation. Chapter 4 contains a discussion of the DN model, which centers around a criticism of the ‘hidden structure strategy’ that Hempel and Railton offered in response to Scriven’s example. Woodward convincingly demolishes this strategy, which assumes that there is, or should be, a full-blown DN account referring to laws of nature underlying the ink bottle story. Moreover, as the notion of ‘law’ itself is controversial, it is dubious to base a theory of explanation on it. To solve this problem Woodward introduces the weaker idea of ‘invariance’ as an alternative for law (explained in Chapter 6). Invariance comes in degrees and it applies to many generalizations that are used in scientific practice but do not qualify as laws (e.g. because they are not exceptionless).

In Chapter 5, Woodward presents his counterfactual theory of explanation, based on his account of causation. It asserts that a good (causal) explanation exhibits patterns of counterfactual dependence that describe the outcomes of interventions. Explanations thereby allow us to answer ‘what-if-things-had-been-different questions’. For example, if we would have intervened on the knee motion, the bottle would not have tipped over. In case of the example given earlier: medical scientists say that if the drug is effective, a patient’s recovery can be explained by the fact that he took the drug. Explaining the recovery of the patient by citing the drug administration amounts to answering the question of what would have happened in case the patient had not taken the drug: he would (probably) not have recovered. A double blind experiment devised to support this explanatory claim can be seen as an attempt to establishing such a counterfactual dependency relation.

This view of explanation contrasts not only with Hempel’s DN model but also with influential contemporary theories of scientific explanation such as Salmon’s causal-mechanical theory and Kitcher’s unificationist theory. (Woodward critically discusses the latter two in Chapter 8). According to Hempel, recovery is explained by fitting it into a nomological pattern: an inductive-statistical argument citing the law that treatment with the drug enhances the probability of recovery. In Salmon’s view, explanation of recovery requires specification of a causal-mechanism in terms of chemical processes and interactions of the drug in the patient’s body. Kitcher holds that an explanation would consist in fitting this particular phenomenon into a larger corpus of derivations, thus showing that it belongs to a unified body of knowledge. An important advantage of Woodward’s approach, in comparison with Hempel’s and Salmon’s, lies in its general applicability. Since it does not make special assumptions about causal mechanisms or require laws of nature, it applies not only to physics but to biomedical and social sciences as well (where mechanisms and laws are harder to find). Because he does not pose unrealistic demands on explanations, Woodward is able to accommodate a wide range of explanatory practices across the various sciences.

This being granted, it is disappointing (at least for philosophers educated in physics, such as the author of this review) that Woodward does not enter into a discussion of problems with causation and explanation in quantum mechanics. Some philosophers regard quantum theory as an esoteric subject that is not representative of science; perhaps Woodward shares this view and wants to compensate for alleged overexposure by not mentioning it at all? But quantum mechanics is a fundamental scientific theory with quite serious repercussions for the philosophical debate about causal explanation. The most notorious case is the problem of explaining the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen (EPR) correlations. These correlations cannot be explained by means of direct causal influence nor by referring to a common cause. Thus, a causal explanation in terms of MT appears to be impossible because one cannot manipulate the outcomes on one wing of the experiment by intervening on the other wing (nor by intervening on the source), although a correlation between outcomes exists. Woodward mentions EPR only once, as a “recherché case” (p. 92), in the context of a discussion of causation as a cluster concept. But it seems to me that anyone who proposes a general theory of scientific explanation should explicitly discuss how it fares within the quantum domain. Salmon, for example, acknowledged the failure of his causal-mechanical model in this respect, a result that he took very seriously.

Kitcher’s unificationist model of explanation, by contrast, has no problems with the explanatory power of quantum mechanics. On Kitcher’s account, the mathematical derivation of the EPR correlations is explanatory by virtue of the fact that quantum mechanics is the maximally unifying systematization of the phenomena in its domain. Moreover, Kitcher’s model has similar virtues as Woodward’s: it is general and independent of the notion of ‘law’. In Chapter 8, Woodward criticizes Kitcher’s views, but not always in a convincing manner. For example, his argument that Kitcher’s account does not sufficiently discriminate between explanatory and nonexplanatory unifications seems to presuppose that all genuine explanation is causal (see p. 363). In sum, Kitcher’s model deserves to be taken more seriously than Woodward does. This observation naturally leads to the question of what the relation is between Woodward’s theory and other types of explanation. Unfortunately Woodward does not deal with this issue. While acknowledging the possible viability of other types of explanation, his strategy is to restrict his work to developing and defending his causal model as far and wide-ranging as possible. He adds that this is preferable to immediately lapsing into a vague pluralism. Perhaps he has a point here, but it is regrettable that he does not place his causal theory of explanation in a wider context of types of explanation.

These critical remarks notwithstanding, Making Things Happen is an extremely important contribution to the debates about causation and explanation. It will become an indispensable reference for anyone who wants to work on these topics.