Marx's Dream: From Capitalism to Communism

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Tom Rockmore, Marx's Dream: From Capitalism to Communism, University of Chicago Press, 2018, 285pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226554525.

Reviewed by Bastian Ronge, Humboldt University Berlin


Tom Rockmore sets out to read Marx "against the background of current problems and possible solutions" (2). He wants to show that Marx, throughout his work, strives "to provide a distinctive new response to the ancient problem of human flourishing" (4) under the conditions of modern industrial society.

The argument towards this thought-provoking thesis is elaborated in three steps, which in turn structure the whole book. In the first part, "On Marx's Theory of Practice" (7-73), Rockmore interprets "Marx's philosophy as a theory of human flourishing" (4), arguing that Marx "spent a life of enormous intellectual toil struggling to bring about the flourishing of human beings" (9) by reexamining Plato's, Rousseau's and, first and foremost, Hegel's accounts of this problem. For Rockmore it is crucial that Marx' economic theory is "based on his philosophical view" (62) and that also his idea of abolishing private property is grounded in his philosophical and practical intention to enable "the development of human beings as individuals, hence to human flourishing in the modern world" (58).

Rockmore's overall claim that all of Marx's theoretical endeavors are dedicated to the practical realization of human flourishing compels him to deny any significant development or even disruption in Marx's lifelong thinking. Hence, the second part of the book, "Marx and Marxism on Materialism, Feuerbach, and Hegel" (73-145), is designated to defend the thesis of continuity in Marx by way of a rigorous juxtaposition of Marx and Marxism. While Marxists usually describe Marx's theoretical work as a development "from philosophy to science, from idealism to material, . . . from ideology to truth" (5), Rockmore wants to establish that Marx is (and always was) a "philosopher either within or at least close to the German idealist tradition" (5) who never seriously tried to leave philosophy behind. In his attempt to "free Marx from his self-appointed Marxist followers" (4), Rockmore focuses on two essential points in the Marxist narrative: the role of Feuerbach one the one hand, and the notion of materialism on the other.

Marxists take Feuerbach's critique of Hegel to be the initial spark that allows Marx to turn his back on philosophy, i.e. on German idealism, and to break through to the scientific standpoint of materialism. Rockmore challenges this hegemonic account by disputing Feuerbach's influence on Marx and deconstructing the standard understanding of materialism (as being opposed to idealism). According to Rockmore, Feuerbach's "direct influence on Marx . . . was mainly limited to reinforcing Marx's interest in philosophical anthropology" (91), and his so-called "transformational criticism" (30) of Hegel in fact was not all that important to Marx as it contains nothing that could not be found already in Hegel himself. Materialism, on the other hand, Rockmore interprets not as the opposite of idealism, as Friedrich Engels and other Mar xists had it, but as a "synonym of 'concrete', hence as practical, as distinguished from what is 'abstract' or 'theoretical'" (82). With this redefinition, Rockmore can argue that Marx's position should better be labeled "neither idealism nor materialism but naturalism or humanism, which lies deeper than and unifies the two supposedly incompatible terms" (88). Against this background, it becomes evident that "Marx's overriding concern is not to overcome Hegel and even less to overcome Feuerbach" (5), as the Marxists claim, but "to solve (or resolve) the modern version of the theme of human flourishing" (5). But which solution to the problem of human flourishing under the conditions of modern industrial society does Marx offer? What exactly is his dream?

This is the crucial question Rockmore's whole argument aims at and which he addresses in the final and most voluminous part of his book, "On the Practice of Marx's Theory, or the Transition from Capitalism to Communism" (147-241). Rockmore finds "four main accounts of the transition" (5) from capitalism to communism in Marx: "The four possible strategies suggested in his writing rely on the proletariat, economics (or political economy), politics, and critique (or critical social theory)" (148). Every single one of these strategies, however, "is problematic" (233), as Rockmore shows in the last chapter.

According to Rockmore, Marx sympathizes with the "ancient Platonic view" (157) that the philosopher is "the authorized guide of everyone else" (157). Hence, the "working class does not now and will not later have the capacity to think for itself" (155), but needs the philosopher to enlighten and guide it. Obviously, this strategy (which blends into the third, namely the political one) is deeply problematic, since it tends to lead to the "dictatorship of the party over the proletariat" (155). The second strategy, "transition through economic crises" (157), is also fraught with problems. Rockmore discusses the "central but mysterious element" (158) of economic crisis at length, since it played and still plays a major role within the Marxist imaginary of how capitalism will come to an end. Rockmore shows that Marx's account of economic crisis is unsatisfying both theoretically -- since Marx does and could not consider the process of financialization -- and empirically -- since his predictions are not "supported by the available economic data" (233).

The third strategy for realizing the transformation from capitalism to communism and, therefore, from a period that systematically hinders human flourishing to a period where true individualism and social freedom can be achieved, is the political one. This strategy played an important role in Marxism, even though Marx himself in his writing offers "no more than a very rudimentary, unsatisfactory account of the political process leading from capitalism to communism" (193). Marxists like Engels or Lenin, however, did not hesitate to "fill the political void" (194) and come up with "crucial concepts, which Marx never clearly states, and which are perhaps . . . incompatible in theory and in practice with his position" (194). These concepts and ideas are the "dictatorship of the proletariat" (first formulated by Joseph Weydemeyer), the notion of the "withering way of the state" (conceptualized by Engels) and the "idea of the party as the vanguard of the revolution" (invented by Lenin). All of these are questionable, Rockmore points out, because they suggest implementing post-capitalist democracy through dictatorial means and can therefore never lead "to human freedom as Marx understands it" (233).

The fourth and final strategy that can be traced back to Marx to bring about the desired social change may be dubbed "critical social theory" (209). This account turns away "from the revolutionary proletariat, away from a Marxian economic solution, and away from Marxist politics" (209). Instead it focuses on the "social function of social criticism" (209), namely on Marx's insight that critique is not just a theoretical endeavor but has and should have also a practical impact on the society that is criticized. Rockmore finds this strategy "clearly stated by Korsch" (209), one of the founding fathers of critical theory, as well as in Habermas, "the most important living thinker . . . associated with critical theory" (210). His main critique of this critical strategy is that it "seeks to realize theory in changing practice, but in practice . . . merely left everything in place" (209). Rockmore attributes this practical ineffectivity of critical theory to its lost connection to economic questions. Neither "first-generation critical thinkers as Max Horkheimer, Theodor Wiesengrund Adorno, and Herbert Marcuse" nor "second-generation critical thinkers such as Habermas and, more recently, Axel Honneth, Nancy Fraser, and others . . . undertake . . . a serious effort to continue the Marxian concern with political economy" (213). However, "mere social critique" (233) cannot be sufficient for effecting the transformation from capitalism to communism. Hence, the crucial question of the study, namely how Marx's "dream [can] be realized not only in theory but also in practice" (232), remains unanswered. None of the four strategies is sufficient to reach that goal. And even China, which is "in some ways [the] most successful Marxist state the world has ever known" (234), cannot serve as a model for realizing human flourishing in Marx's sense. On the contrary, the "Chinese situation is the most important contemporary illustration of the inability to realize Marx's theory" (240), Rockmore claims at the end of his book.

Rockmore's study, which is much richer in philosophical contextualization and considerations than could be accounted for here, in one important respect is poorer than expected. It falls short of its methodological promise "to understand him [Marx] through his own texts rather than seeking to understand him through Marxism" (1). Rockmore succeeds in turning away from Marxism, but he does not do so by listening carefully to Marx's own voice. Rockmore's firm intention to free Marx from Marxism presses him to provide the reader with interpretations that seem unnecessarily forced -- for example where he reduces the famous Theses on Feuerbach to some "short text [that] was supposedly composed as a first effort at what later became the Feuerbach chapter in The German Ideology" (103), or where he, throughout the book, portrays Engels as the bad guy who has no expertise either in philosophy or in political economy (cf. 4) and is mainly responsible for Marxism's misconstructions of Marx. The study would have been much more convincing had Rockmore held on to his initial methodological maxim and portrayed Marx through his own text. Then it would have become apparent that Marx neither heads straight for a new materialist science, as Engels and Marxists want us to believe, nor all his life reflects on the question of human flourishing, as Rockmore maintains, but is someone whose theoretical work, from the beginning to the very end, remains a work in progress. However, escaping is never easy -- neither from philosophy, as Rockmore's study shows, nor from the desire for clear-cut interpretations, as his study involuntarily proves as much as the Marxist's interpretations he criticizes.