Mass Hysteria: Medicine, Culture, and Mothers' Bodies

Placeholder book cover

Rebecca Kukla, Mass Hysteria: Medicine, Culture, and Mothers' Bodies, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 2005, 251pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 0742533581.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Brake, University of Calgary


Mass Hysteria is a wide-ranging, subtle, and beguiling philosophical investigation into historical and contemporary understandings of maternal bodies. Rebecca Kukla documents the post-Enlightenment development of anxieties surrounding motherhood and shows how these fears continue to affect the care mothers receive. This book will be of special interest to bioethicists, feminist philosophers, and those interested in the philosophical history of medicine.


One of the theses of Mass Hysteria is that there is "a mutually constitutive relationship between the dynamic boundaries of maternal bodies and the care these bodies have received." (3) While Kukla sensibly avoids debates over social construction, she investigates how social understandings of pregnancy affect the procedures surrounding it, including medical research and practice, and so shape mothers' experiences of their own bodies. With a sharp eye for detail, Kukla documents how the preoccupations governing these practices are continuous with anxieties emerging during the Enlightenment. These preoccupations have fostered an over-emphasis on mother-infant proximity and a denial of maternal separateness, both of which contribute to women's oppression.

In making her case, Kukla examines a diverse set of texts: seventeenth- and eighteenth-century European midwifery and nursing tracts, Rousseau's political writings, contemporary guides to pregnancy and breastfeeding, scholarly medical articles, and breastfeeding advocacy literature. Kukla contends that two images of the maternal body, emerging in French Revolutionary times, have influenced the Western cultural imagination of, and consequently the care received by, maternal bodies. Like the virgin and the whore as figures of female sexuality, the "Fetish Mother" and the "Unruly Mother" are two sides of the same ideological coin. The "Fetish Mother," an idealization, is seen as inexhaustibly productive and physically fused with her infant. In contrast, the "Unruly Mother's" harmful vagaries must be policed lest they deform her fetus, and, ultimately, society. In Kukla's account, these figures of motherhood appeared in response to Post-Enlightenment political anxieties.

The Enlightenment reduced nature "to a mechanical array, intrinsically devoid of norms and values," (34) and subject to human control. This implied, problematically, that there was no natural grounding of harmonious social order. Rousseau's solution to this problem, Kukla argues, vested great responsibility in mothers. Rousseau thought that citizens could be socialized into appropriate sentiments -- society "must inculcate in them the proper second natures" (39):

Do you want to bring everyone back to his first duties? Begin with mothers… . Everything follows successively from that first depravity [namely wet-nursing]… . But let mothers deign to nurse their children, morals will reform themselves, nature's sentiments will be awakened in every heart … (Rousseau, cited in Kukla, 30; Kukla's interpolation)

Rousseau's work marks a number of transitions. First, it marks a transition in the understanding of natural pregnancy. In the seventeenth-century texts which Kukla examines, intervention is seen as compatible with natural childbirth, even as instrumental in producing natural (as opposed to unnaturally impaired) infants. After the Enlightenment, interventions such as wet-nursing are seen as unnatural, and pregnancy guides do not merely aim at preventing impairment, but at enhancing nature. Second, Rousseau's writings sparked a major cultural shift from viewing motherhood as a purely private matter to viewing it as a civic responsibility. Pregnancy became (among other things) a public project, producing sociable second natures and hence an undivided society.

Kukla argues that the "Fetish Mother" emerges in Post-Revolutionary political and medical rhetoric. Whether or not Rousseau literally meant that children would drink in patriotism with their mothers' milk, his contemporaries and followers believed that her milky bond with her child created the bond between citizens. Her physical unity with her child was also a symbol of social unity. For example, the French Republic was often represented as a nursing mother. But her power stimulated fear of the "Unruly Mother." Where the "Fetish Mother" brings order and social unity, the "Unruly Mother" brings disorder and division. Anxieties about the dangerous maternal body and about distance between mother and child increased as power was invested in the maternal body.

These eighteenth-century fears draw on older understandings of pregnant bodies as subject to dangerous passions and particularly permeable to emotional or mental influences. The seventeenth-century theory of "maternal imagination" held that pregnant women's psychological states could directly affect fetuses -- for example, a woman's craving for strawberries might produce a child with a strawberry-shaped birthmark; her looking at a picture of a black man at the moment of conception (!) might produce an "Etheopian" child (15). In light of this susceptibility, the maternal body was seen as needing protection from dangerous infiltrations. Ironically, this prompted a post-Enlightenment return to first nature, with the "Fetish Mother" becoming idealized as natural. Due to the importance attached to protecting her permeable boundaries, medical interventions were decried as artificial. Meanwhile, to prevent disorder, the "Unruly Mother" was increasingly subjected to surveillance and control.

While the two images of maternity contrast, both, Kukla writes, are

born of the idea that the maternal body is responsible for the production of human and social nature, properly governed by normative laws of nature, and easily corrupted and interrupted. Both maternal bodies enjoy an exceptionally tight relationship with infant bodies, whether this relationship is one of romantic unity or of the transmittal of disorder. Both bodies are peculiarly public … : [but whereas] the Fetish Mother functions as a public spectacle symbolizing and creating natural order, the Unruly Mother's body needs to be displaced into public space so that it can be prevented from spreading hysteria and unnatural disorder. (85)

Through these figures, the "space and boundaries of mother's bodies became contested sites." (97) Invoking the ancient understanding of hysteria as the womb wandering through the body, Kukla claims that anxieties about the containment of the maternal body are themselves hysterical -- they are worries about the consequences of the displacement of the womb on the body politic (thus, mass hysteria). However, because this "hysteria" relates to fears about social disorder caused by aberrant pregnant women, they prompt increasing displacement of the uterus into public space through dissection, anatomical representations in obstetrics texts, and (today) ultrasound images. Thus, the pregnant body is increasingly subjected to policing, inhibiting women's autonomy. Simultaneously, the pregnant woman or mother is denied robust boundaries because she is thought of as united with her fetus or infant, and because her boundaries must be penetrated in the interests of surveillance and social order.

In Part Two, Kukla traces the effects of these ideas in contemporary practices. Her readings of medical literature and advice texts like the popular What to Expect When You're Expecting are sobering and sometimes hilarious; here, I can only focus on one example, breastfeeding. Kukla analyzes breastfeeding literature in light of the over-valuation of the tight connection between mother and infant and the fear of social disorder when the two are disunited. Her historical approach illuminates the tendency of the guides to reduce mothering to nursing and to emphasize physical proximity. The texts she cites focus on breastfeeding to the exclusion of other embodied aspects of mothering and suggest that failure at breastfeeding amounts to failure at mothering. Even scientific studies of breastfeeding ignore the alternative of pumping (a method of delivering breast milk without physical proximity). Further, breastfeeding is portrayed as an ecstatic bonding experience. But despite government-funded ad campaigns, the US has extremely low rates of breastfeeding.

This public health problem showcases the innovativeness of Kukla's approach. Concern about low breastfeeding rates usually focuses on institutional hurdles for working women or the machinations of formula peddlers. But while Kukla accepts the need for institutional change, she argues that the unrealistic expectations fostered by breastfeeding advocacy are part of the problem. False beliefs about the experience cause mothers with divergent sensations to feel they have failed and give up. Further, the univocal presentation of maternal experience harms women whose experience differs from what is presented as the norm. A case in point is that of Denise Perrigo, who called a crisis line when she experienced sexual feelings while breastfeeding (a physiologically normal reaction). The counselor called the police, and Perrigo was charged with being an unfit mother. Breastfeeding literature which does not address, or offer a safe place to express, such feelings (as, Kukla argues, the most common texts do not) fails women.

More generally, Kukla identifies the lack of separateness accorded to maternal bodies as problematic (and as caused by fetishizing physical proximity). While she criticizes medical practice for bias, she does not suggest rejecting it, acknowledging that it has enabled huge advances in fetal, infant, and maternal health. Instead she advocates greater awareness of how its biases contribute to women's oppression. For example, over-valuing proximity produces an unbalanced insistence that women stay near their children and induces guilt in them when they do not -- when, for instance, they work outside the home.


Mass Hysteria touches on many philosophical topics; I will focus on its contribution to feminist bioethics. As Sue Sherwin wrote in her ground-breaking work, No Longer Patient, "the practice of medicine serves as an important instrument in the continuing disempowerment of women (and members of other oppressed groups) in society."[1] One task of feminist bioethics is to evaluate medical practice, identifying when and how it disempowers women. Kukla's theory of the "Fetish Mother" sheds light on, among other practices, the medical and legal coercion of pregnant women. Such coercion -- including forced surgery and imprisonment for 'fetal abuse' -- has long been an issue of concern in feminist bioethics. As Sherwin wrote, "women are described as irresponsible or hostile towards their fetuses, and the relationship between them is characterized as adversarial,"[2] and these stereotypes are used to deprive pregnant women of autonomy in making their own medical choices.

In her proposed "fix" to the boundaries of mothers' bodies, Kukla challenges the liberal feminist approach to this issue. Liberal feminism has focused on the rights of pregnant women, even when such rights come into conflict with fetuses' best interests -- a position which inevitably recognizes the potential for maternal-fetal conflict. But Kukla rejects this "coarse ontology of selfhood and of rights," pointing out that it assumes pregnant women are "unproblematically bounded" when in fact their "very nature and boundaries [as agents] are themselves under contest." (137) Kukla argues that mothers need "limits, privacy, a separate identity, self-determination, and a room of our own," (231) but also that a mother's commitment to her child is constitutive of, not in conflict with, her self.

Kukla argues that liberal feminism's attempt to uphold women's agency is undercut by its failure to see that "our cultural understanding of the appropriate breastfeeding body demands an erasure of mothers' independent agency from the start." (202) Without a strong sense of their own boundaries and separateness from their children, women cannot even have a sense of their own interests. More fundamental than protecting women's agency is that women understand themselves as independent agents.

However, I would hope that liberal feminism can answer to this insight. Indeed, Kukla concludes that idealizing physical proximity is problematic because it threatens mothers' autonomy. Like liberal feminists, she presupposes that such autonomy is valuable. The difference seems to be that liberal feminists assume that the threat to women's autonomy is that their choices will be overridden, but for Kukla, the threat is more fundamental: some mothers "cannot find an acceptable way to construe [themselves] as separate from [their] infant[s] at all." (202) That is, social pressures on pregnant women and new mothers undermine their sense of agency altogether, preventing them from having any interests of their own.

Nonetheless, the liberal feminist fight against unjust restrictions on pregnant women and new mothers, in particular against legal compulsions to sacrifice their interests to their fetuses', is crucial to protect women's autonomy. Kukla's point is that more is needed in order for women to have meaningful autonomy. In particular, what is needed are medical and social practices which recognize pregnant women and mothers as separate agents with diverse experiences and do not define good motherhood in terms of constant physical proximity. But, in contrast to Kukla, I think liberal feminism can require this of the state. I have argued elsewhere that a liberal feminist who takes seriously the idea of state neutrality and the insights of feminists like Catharine MacKinnon -- who criticize liberal rights as inefficacious in light of social pressures on women's choices -- need not ignore the effects of social pressures.[3] For the state constructs many aspects of our lives through its provision of education, healthcare, and so on. In providing these services, a neutral state should not assume gender stereotypes. Thus, state-provided healthcare (following Norman Daniels, I think a liberal state should offer this) should not assume a controversial -- and oppressive -- conception of good mothering. Medical services, advocacy campaigns, and health education provided by a liberal state should not assume that good mothering requires constant proximity, that it is reducible to breastfeeding, or that there is a single correct experience of pregnancy and motherhood. Thus I am more optimistic than Kukla that liberal feminism has theoretical resources to protect mothers' senses of their own boundaries.

This does not, however, address another problem Kukla raises with liberal feminism. She points out that, traditionally, the liberal self has been conceived as fundamentally independent from others. This suggests that individuals must either be united (as in Rousseau's general will) or in conflict. It does not provide for maternal selves which are partially constituted by commitment to their children but also in need of separateness. This is a challenge for liberal feminism. In my view, there are good reasons to conceptualize rights-bearers as potentially in conflict, so that there are clear guidelines when conflicts do arise. But a theory which considers other ways of relating might better address feminist issues, especially concerning the family. If some mothers experience their own boundaries as fluctuating, a theory which assumes rigid boundaries might fail to address their needs. Of course, a Rawlsian liberal might reply that persons behind the veil of ignorance might consider the possibility that their boundaries will fluctuate. But in line with a number of recent feminists, Kukla gives reason for liberals to think this issue through more thoroughly.


Mass Hysteria is the kind of book the reading of which places new filters on one's experience of the world. Shortly after reading it, I happened to watch a film, Nina's Tragedies, which unironically invokes the theory of maternal imagination: a shot of Nina, the pregnant heroine, smiling is followed immediately by an ultrasound image of a fetus (Nina's, presumably), also smiling. Kukla's thesis also explains, for me, the recently ubiquitous images of pregnant female stars on supermarket tabloid covers. Perhaps their popularity is due to increasing political divisions within the United States -- the kind of social disunity which the "Fetish Mother" is supposed to heal. While I haven't been able to discuss all the strands of this provocative and thought-provoking book, I hope to have suggested the interest and urgency of its insights.

[1] Susan Sherwin, No Longer Patient: Feminist Ethics and Health Care (Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1992), p. 84.

[2] Sherwin, 107.

[3] Elizabeth Brake, "Rawls and Feminism: What Should Feminists Make of Liberal Neutrality?," Journal of Moral Philosophy 1 (2004), pp. 295-312.