Meaning and Authenticity: Bernard Lonergan and Charles Taylor on the Drama of Authentic Human Existence

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Brian J. Braman, Meaning and Authenticity: Bernard Lonergan and Charles Taylor on the Drama of Authentic Human Existence, University of Toronto Press, 2008, 138pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780802098023.

Reviewed by David Burrell, C.S.C., University of Notre Dame/Uganda Martyrs University, Nkozi


It has long been customary for America's freestanding colleges to support philosophical gurus, whose presence helped to make those institutions what they were: seedbeds (that is, "seminaries") of critical thinking, where young over-achievers would be invited to scrutinize the import of their "career plans." One wonders whether the goal-driven aspirations of today's academe will allow such figures to be replaced as they become emeriti, but we can hope "in sh'Allah!" The two figures compared and contrasted in this valedictory study -- Charles Taylor and Bernard Lonergan -- have functioned that way for many on a far wider screen. But how can one be a philosophical guru on the world scene? Brian Braman's analysis of each thinker helps to respond to that question, in the measure that one can. Focusing on "authenticity" allows him to elucidate the point of the engagement in inquiry which they share, and suggest how each of them might help us to find and execute the point of our own intellectual inquiry. In that sense, each of these prospective mentors exhibits the telos proper to classical philosophy: searching for what is true and good, and doing so in such a way as to appropriate what we discover; that is, make it our own. For the promise of philosophical inquiry has ever been to carry us beyond the preoccupations of our mundane selves, which Braman takes to be the sense of "authenticity" which they share: "a way of living one's life in a new dimension" (98-99). I take that final characterization of his study to be both more modest and more accurate than his definition opening the concluding chapter: "authenticity for Taylor and Lonergan is the experience of a profound transfiguration in one's being and doing" (98). For if Lonergan can freely use the term 'experience', that is only (I would surmise) because he seems quite innocent of that loaded "subjective" sense which Taylor is astute enough to avoid. So replacing 'is the experience of', from Braman's valedictory statement, with the more modest 'reflects' will offer a less contested summary of the subject of his inquiry: "authenticity for Taylor and Lonergan reflects a profound transfiguration in one's being and doing."

Now "transfigurations" normally defy descriptive language, precisely because what takes place there invites us well beyond the ordinary reach of our discourse, invariably moving us to evocative and analogous speech, so leading into what Kierkegaard dubbed "edifying discourse." And if that goal never escaped classical philosophical inquiry, it has come to describe, in our time, the role of gurus. That alteration in the very conception and practice of "philosophy" deserves more than comment, and Taylor himself has devoted more than 900 pages to exploring the manifold factors helping to bring it about in his recent A Secular Age; yet for now let it simply explain why those of us fortunate enough to encounter such inspiring teachers often found them more engaging in person than in print. In fact, many of them wrote little, though some, like these, have been prolific. Yet even here the teacher/student encounter will differ qualitatively from that of readers encountering their written works, as Plato insisted in his Seventh Letter. In fact, I have often found it difficult to introduce friends and colleagues to two of my most inspiring teachers -- Bernard Lonergan for one, and Wilfrid Sellars for another -- with only their writings to offer. And my brief but intense interaction with Charles Taylor (in Oxford in 2005) suggests something similar. Not that his writings or those of Bernard Lonergan cannot effect a stimulating entrée into their respective worlds and intentions, but that personal encounter will do it far better. And that precisely because their respective "worlds" are ever calling them and their students beyond themselves. For their distinctive modes of inquiry are designed to respect and to implement the telos proper to philosophical inquiry, which seeks to realize Socrates' ideal of consistency between thought and action; that is, to move beyond mere logical consistency to personal appropriation. Again, that is what prospective students often anticipate in "philosophy," and if they find themselves disappointed rather than fulfilled, we (philosophers) have no one to blame but ourselves! For we have regularly been taught to settle for (indeed to make an icon of) "logical consistency," while relegating Socrates' further call to another realm; perhaps to "theology."

Yet recalling that quite modern bifurcation -- philosophy/theology -- exhibits another merit of Braman's study, for by rightly eschewing the labels yet directing us to the mentors inspiring each -- Heidegger for Taylor and Aquinas for Lonergan -- he gestures towards their respective horizons: philosophical for Taylor and theological for Lonergan. Yet again, he is wise not to offer those distracting labels but moves immediately to the way each elucidates a path to "a profound transfiguration in one's being and doing." While Taylor employs a hermeneutic strategy redolent of Heidegger, he nevertheless focuses his "moral ontology [on] phronesis -- practical reasoning," in the spirit of "Aristotle's aletheuein -- living in the truth" (37). So then it becomes natural to raise "demands for ethical judgments," or those constitutive goods which Taylor dubs "hypergoods": "that is, goods that are not only incomparably more important than the others but provide the standpoint from which these must be weighed and decided about" (30). In other words, the dialectical progression built into our inherently analogous use of 'good' demands that we find one which will order the others. Taylor buttresses this characteristically Augustinian move with the notion of epiphany: "the manifestation which brings us into the presence of something which is otherwise inaccessible, and which is of the highest moral or spiritual significance" (43). Astute readers will note how recourse to "knowing by presence" is latent in the cognate notions of manifestation or presence, so as neatly to bypass modern preoccupations with "representation" or analytic demands for "conceptualization." Yet the very term 'epiphany' reminds us that this step is already latent in the activity of interpretation which shapes philosophical inquiry for Taylor. Although epiphanies will arise freely, they are neither totally unexpected nor unrecognizable when they do arise. These "hypergoods" must be the goal inherent in our entire activity of inquiry.

Here lies the interior point of connection between Taylor and Lonergan, between two Canadians of different generations yet like-minded in their faith; one a quintessential university person, and the other a Jesuit whose formation in the "spiritual exercises" of Ignatius of Loyola became more evident as his life of inquiry unfolded, from Canada to England, then to Rome, and finally to Boston College in the United States. While those who have inquired into Lonergan's patterns of thought tend to find the inspiration for his dynamic epistemology in the Belgian Jesuit, Maréchal, his own reflections turn to John Henry Newman as his professed mentor. It is Newman of the Grammar of Assent, for whom understanding is a thoroughly personal engagement with realities which mind alone can discern. Following Newman at this crucial juncture, "Lonergan understands knowledge as performative -- knowledge of the subject as subject in act (engaged)" (81), as the mind itself "is a dynamic longing within the person for wholeness and completion" (56). Indeed, both Lonergan and Taylor are clear about “coming to know [as] a common enterprise" (82). Lonergan locates this quest in "the dynamic unity of consciousness as experiencing, understanding, and judging that constitutes human knowing in its fullest and truest sense" (61). "Under the sway of reason," the desire to know is distinguished from all other desires in that it "does not seek to possess, master, or control its object" (60). So we are not surprised to learn that the detachment inherent in such a desire (de Chardin) tends ineluctably towards a threefold "conversion: intellectual, moral and religious" (59). Lonergan will then identify "intellectual conversion [as] the affirmation of our self as knower" (62), moral conversion as the exigency for performative consistency (Socrates), and religious conversion as coming to "be in love with the divine ground [which] reveals to us to whom we are ultimately responsible and to whom we ultimately respond in self-transcending love" (68). This is, of course, full-blown theological language, which Lonergan is freer to use than Taylor, insisting that "sustained authenticity is impossible without growth in a loving relationship fully brought to fruition by being in love with the source of all meaning and value" (94).

So Braman concludes by reminding us how both "Taylor and Lonergan agree with Augustine in holding the priority of love [over] knowledge" (99). Although such an affirmation was always latent in the inner dynamic of Lonergan's "unrestricted desire to know," affirming it remained for him a later development, much as Taylor's explicit faith pronouncements would wait for the more autobiographical remarks found in James Heft's edition: A Catholic Modernity (Oxford, 1999). Gurus can become gurus only when they are addressing a palpable need, yet will continue to be so only as they lead those with such needs to a critical appropriation of their own desire to know and to love. So if the language must be theological in the end, the modality will be thoroughly philosophical, so Braman's way of finessing that difference between these two is again to be commended.