Media Ethics, Free Speech, and the Requirements of Democracy

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Carl Fox and Joe Saunders (eds.), Media Ethics, Free Speech, and the Requirements of Democracy, Routledge, 2019, 270pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138571921.

Reviewed by Win-chiat Lee, Wake Forest University


Carl Fox and Joe Saunders have put together an excellent collection of thirteen new essays that address timely and troubling issues in our democratic political discourse related in one way or another to speech and the media. A diversity of specific topics is covered, including fake news, dogwhistles, political correctness, offensiveness, hate speech, and biased reporting, often in the context of recent events such as the Brexit Vote and the Survivor Issue of Charlie Hebdo. The interrelations among the three topics in the book's title are addressed by the book as a whole, with a coherence not always found in collections of essays, especially if they, like this one, originate in a conference. The chapters explore and discuss their topics typically with depth, involving not only moral and political philosophy, but in some cases also philosophy of language and epistemology. Some of the chapters also incorporate insights from other disciplines, such as cognitive science and sociology.

In this review, I will summarize each of the chapters to convey a sense of the rich diversity of the subjects addressed and offer brief questions or critical remarks where they arise.

The book is divided into three parts. Part I, "Democracy and the Media," begins with Jennifer Saul's insightful account of why calling out the racist dogwhistles in the Brexit Campaign was not effective in defusing them. Saul appeals to the protean nature of the Brexit dogwhistles, such as the use of the term "immigrants" with shifting references, to explain the failure in triggering self-monitoring even for those who have also accepted anti-racist norms. Some of the groups associated with the term "immigrants" in Britain are not covered by existing, well-established anti-racist or anti-bigotry norms.

Julian Baggini's chapter begins with the timely reminder of how important a responsible media is to a democracy's health. The main (and well-taken) ethical points he makes in relation to how to conduct a proper interview, especially with a political figure, are: first, aim the interrogation at what matters, and second, avoid techniques that are unfair or unjust.

The most interesting point made by Baggini is a background issue. In his view, one cannot always distinguish the professional ethics of a journalist from the skills and craft that she should have. A journalist who fails to get interviewees to talk about what matters fails in both her professional ethics and her craft. But how does one define the profession of journalism that grounds both the ethics and the craft? Baggini refers mainly to the role journalism plays in promoting fair hearing of a diversity of viewpoints in a democracy. But this raises the question of whether journalism's role depends on the particular social/political context so that it is one thing in a democratic society and something else in a totalitarian society. Even in a democratic society, can we rule out the role of a propagandist or an entertainer for a journalist? These seem to be fundamental questions for a book on journalist/media ethics and should have received more attention.

Saunders discusses the problem of political campaign consultants/strategists. He focuses on the Australian political strategist Lynton Crosby who employed maneuvers such as dogwhistles and "dead-cats" (red herrings intended to distract) to win general elections for his clients in several countries. Crosby conducts polls to find out what the soft swing voters would respond to and tailors campaign messages -- misleading ones at best -- to cater to them. His maneuvers work because people can be manipulated and, worse, they may not even be aware of such manipulation.

Is this kind of manipulation, albeit poll-based, anti-democratic? Saunders believes it is. In his view, for democracy, i.e., self-government of the people, to be meaningful, we need "to know what we are voting for such that we can make an informed decision in line with our values, interests, and beliefs." (61-62) Essential to the democratic process of public deliberation, political debates in an election, in Saunders's view, should therefore be real debates about real issues.  No doubt media can play a role in facilitating such real debates. Saunders suggests that publicly funded media could provide a forum for such debates. But it is unclear whether he thinks it is ultimately the voters' responsibility to guard themselves against manipulations and ensure that they vote for the right kinds of reasons, as Saunders' idea of collective autonomy seems to suggest.

Much of what we think about how journalists ought to report the news or present an issue (balanced, fair and neutral), in order to be trusted, is founded on the epistemic model of how our minds works -- that we aim at true beliefs and judge autonomously what we have reason to believe. In her chapter, Carrie Figdor rejects this model and argues that we should, instead, think of our minds more in terms of motivated reasoning that is social and cultural in nature. Maintaining one's self-image or social relations and considerations such as conflict with prior beliefs, values, and goals enter into one's calculation of information risk and whether to trust the source of the information presented. Balanced reporting is, however, not totally futile, in Figdor's view. Everyone's comfort level with perceived information risk is not the same. Furthermore, the epistemic goal of truth might still carry weight for some. Framing an issue that resonates more with the audience's worldview or value, on this account, also becomes important. Figdor, however, does not question whether balanced reporting is even sustainable as a goal for the journalists. Journalists are people and subject to motivated reasoning too.

We take for granted that politicians in a democratic society are entitled to less privacy than the rest of us because some of their publicly accountable actions, such as corruption, can take place in private. Rob Lawlor and Kevin Macnish, worry that the press's license to gather information about the politicians' private lives makes it possible for them to hold public officials hostage and subject them to manipulation, resulting in the press holding more power than is good for society. As safeguards, Lawlor and Macnish suggest "Principles of Just Surveillance." Among the requirements are a just cause or a reasonable suspicion of wrongdoing to justify surveillance (thus disallowing "fishing expeditions"), proportionality of the surveillance to the suspected wrongdoing, and reasonable expectation of success. While these principles are reasonable, it is unclear whether they are intended to be legal safeguards. If the problem is that the law allows the media too much leeway or that the journalists might be unscrupulous when it comes to politicians' privacy, then the safeguards would have to be legal and involve sanctions and not mere clarifications of our ethical thinking or revisions of the professional code of ethics.

Part II, "Free Speech and the Media," begins with Gerald Lang's discussion of free speech in a liberal community. I will focus on two of three potential problems Lang identifies for J. S. Mill's liberal theory of unrestricted expression. First, exposure to unrestricted expression of others in the form of criticism or contempt and ridicule might impede the development of a person's individuality. Second, unrestricted speech might amplify the vulnerability of those members of society who are already marginalized and feeling vulnerable.

In Lang's view, these do not present real problems or constitute grounds for restriction of speech for Mill. Among the reasons Lang gives, most important for present purposes is Mill's belief in the free association of individuals. By the same token, however, what cannot be restricted in society-at-large for reasons of free association of individuals may be so restricted in sub-sectors formed by the free association of individuals. Consistent with Mill's theory, Lang argues for the positive steps that can and should be taken to construct public social space for sub-sectors of society, such as universities, governed by more demanding norms of respectful interactions among individuals.

The topic for Waleed Aly and Robert Mark Simpson is political correctness, which they define as "a suite of social practices that involve avoiding or policing behavior -- usually speech -- that is seen as derogating people in subordinated social groups." (125) (This definition suits the authors' purpose, but might otherwise be a little narrow.) The troubling part of the practice of political correctness, according to them, is not so much the policing of behavior or speech per se, but that it now takes place in cyber-space. With the rise of social media and the internet, the policing of political correctness can become ubiquitous and target even the most innocent people for very minor infractions. As a result, people are subject to "cyber-mobbing" and public shaming, i.e., the "social tyranny" Mill warns about, except that the new online social tyranny is even more unstructured, random, and unpredictable, and not even limited by national boundaries. Worse, the severe harm to individuals can be amplified if the online attacks get picked up by mainstream off-line media.

Aly and Simpson's advice for those whose politics is to promote respect and equality for all is: take it offline. This is sounding a retreat. But perhaps there is no taming the beast of online free speech. As they claim, "When it comes to online communication, opposing rhetorical extremes seem to exist in a state of symbiosis." (141)

After the terrorist attack on its office that ended with twelve people killed, the French publication Charlie Hebdo put out a "Survivor Issue" featuring on its cover the cartoon depiction of the prophet Muhammad. Fox discusses the media's avoidance, so as not to offend Muslims, of actually showing that front cover. He believes that there is a dilemma in this kind of situation. On the one hand, within a democracy, the press has a duty to provide certain information or viewpoint to the public even if it should turn out to be offensive to some. On the other hand, in a liberal society, everyone ought to treat others with equal respect in their public interaction, thus refraining from public expressions that are offensive to others for reasons such as religion. Because of these two duties, Fox believes that if the press can provide the same needed information without being offensive, then it should do so.

Fox thinks that it follows from the fact that the media plays such an important role in a democracy that it belongs to what Rawls calls "the basic structure of society" and is therefore subject to the use of public reason in justifying what it does. Fox's overall argument is more complex and nuanced, but I do find this particular inference problematic. First, the political importance of journalism is insufficient to justify treating the role of a journalist as comparable to that of a judge or a legislator. Second, public reason in Rawlsian reasonable pluralism excludes justification based on reasons peculiar to a particular worldview. The duty not to be offensive by depicting the prophet Mohammad must therefore be grounded, for the purposes of public reasons, on shared general values, such as religious freedom or tolerance. But I doubt that these values will cover a broad, general requirement of non-offensiveness, as that requirement could lead to holding some practices hostage, as in the case of same-sex marriage, to the feelings of particular religions, contravening tolerance. Fox is right in thinking that there are good reasons not to be callous when one can avoid being offensive without sacrificing something valuable. But being callous is just as bad for any private person as it is for a journalist in her public role.

Kay Mathiesen tackles fake news and makes a moral case for its censorship. In her view, none of the three moral grounds for the freedom of expression she examines, namely, autonomy, utility and democracy, point to any legitimate interest on the part of the speaker, the audience, or society in general served by fake news. I agree, but would point out that her conclusion is not as controversial as one might think, because fake news of sorts is already censored or subject to severe restriction in many areas without serious objections. Falsehoods in advertising, medical information, and corporate disclosures, as well as libel, are examples of fake news, online or offline, that are subject to legal restriction and penalty. A more difficult question for Mathiesen to address would be: why are we more reluctant to subject fake news in some areas, but not others, especially those that might involve political interests, to censorship?

Part III is entitled, "Bias, Ideology, and the Media." David Livingstone Smith begins his chapter with the conceptual point that "ideology" is best understood in terms of its teleological function. The function of ideologies is then narrowly defined as "promoting the oppression of one group of people by another." Ideologies' function is performed through systems of representations. Media, broadly understood, serves the function of ideologies by creating and transmitting the relevant systems of representations. Given the right environment, an ideology can become causally efficacious in bringing about the associated oppressive practice. Media can also have a role in "breaking" an ideology by pointing out what is false in an ideology and by contributing to the environment in which the ideology can no longer be causally efficacious.

Lorna Finlayson worries about the kind of explanation found in the press (and other places) of certain outcomes, such as the vote for Brexit or the election of Donald Trump, as crucially due to some people voting against their own interests. Why do they vote against their own interests? Because they are stupid, according to this kind of explanation dubbed, "the Stupid Theory". Finlayson likens this kind of explanation to the Marxian idea of "false consciousness," according to which people are sometimes simply duped. She worries about false consciousness stories being condescending toward the subjects of these stories, but not in cases where the shoe actually fits. There are indeed cases where the idea of false consciousness is actually explanatory because of the function false beliefs serve in creating and sustaining a repressive social order. The problem, rather, is that (perhaps due to intellectual laziness) it is too readily invoked where it does not apply, as she believes is the case with the Brexit vote or the Trump election. False false consciousness stories might also serve ideological purposes in some cases. As Finlayson wisely reminds us, critique-of-ideology should be a reflexive practice.

The last two chapters cover similar ground. They are the only ones in the volume that address the ethics of news consumption. Christopher Meyers begins by arguing for partisan reporting and against what he calls "the objectivity standard" which involves neutrality among viewpoints and commitment to a balance of views. While journalism should strive to be truthful and take into consideration diverse viewpoints, Meyers thinks that "neutrality" or "balance" is neither achievable nor desirable. Objective neutrality in reporting is associated with the ideal of "mirroring" an event as it is in itself which is both epistemologically and practically impossible. What constitutes an event and what is newsworthy already requires judgements and "biases" in the sense of being discriminating. However, as long as the media as a whole is sufficiently wide-ranging in partisanship, consumers of news will have resources to receive and comprehend news from a variety of ideological and political standpoints. Meyers believes it is the responsibility of news consumers to subject themselves to ideological dissonance by consuming news from a variety of sources.

Meyers, unfortunately, does not explain how the serious news consumers can decide among the different takes of a story offered by different news sources. If journalists, as Meyers believes, can only view the world through their ideological and partisan "filters", would the news consumers have to compare and assess the journalists' different ideological or political standpoints first in order to determine whose take is more believable? Would that, then, defeat the point of diversifying one's news sources by political stands?

In the final chapter, Alex Worsnip also makes a case for the obligation to diversify our news sources. He begins by arguing that we have epistemic obligations not only in our response to evidence, but also in the gathering of evidence -- that it not be skewed or biased. The problem is to come up with the appropriate conception of bias for news sources. The requisite conception must neither disparage a news source's exercising judgements (that is what news sources are supposed to do) nor require us to judge the accuracy of the source (thus risking choosing outlets that echo our own beliefs). Worsnip suggests "illicit influences" as the appropriate conception of bias. Illicit influences happen when one fails to either believe or report certain inconvenient descriptive facts because of some non-epistemic interests one has, such as one's desires, aims, or normative beliefs, as well as the normative stance of one's news organization. Worsnip thinks illicit influences exist across the political spectrum. The right and the left simply have different descriptive truths they find inconvenient. As long as everyone is susceptible to them, we can fulfill our epistemic obligation to have good evidence for our beliefs only by diversifying our sources for news, especially in terms of their political bent. Indeed, it is also our moral obligation not to base our actions on beliefs formed on the basis of a skewed and incomplete picture of the evidence.

I find Worsnip's rigorous and complex epistemological arguments persuasive. But he does not address questions about the status of the obligations he draws from normative epistemology in the face of challenges from cognitive science and psychology, such as the model of motivated reasoning Figdor invokes. Worsnip needs to do that because the problem he addresses has to do with people "afflicted" with motivated reasoning to begin with, as the illicit influences he refers to, by his own account, are results of motivated reasoning (249). If reporters and editors cannot get past their motivated reasoning and fulfill their epistemic obligations, can we, as news consumers, harbor much hope in doing so (see Figdor's chapter) even if we have the benefit of the reporting from multiple sources?

I also have questions about how much diversification of our news sources across partisan divide will do for us. The particular kind of bias at issue (and thus what we have to correct for) only leads a news source to have gaps or omissions in its coverage of descriptive facts. We would therefore need another source from across the partisan divide to round out the set of facts we need to form our beliefs. Sources, especially those of different political bent, however, not only cover different facts, but also give us conflicting descriptive accounts. This is because motivated reasoning works on the news sources in ways far more complicated and deeper than just the convenient omission of certain descriptive facts. Take everyone's favorite example -- climate change. It is far less clear that diversification across the political divide will provide a better evidence base for our beliefs about climate change. If we diversify in these cases, we do something Worsnip (248) and others in the volume argue journalists shouldn't do, namely, "balanced" reporting of both sides of the story with neutrality in a manner suggesting the factual evidence is less settled than it is.

My questions and critical remarks notwithstanding, this is an excellent book filled with original and thought-provoking arguments. As any good book in applied ethics, it should appeal to a broad audience as well as to professional philosophers. Scholars and advanced students in other related fields, as well as practitioners of journalism will find this book rewarding and accessible. It might be helpful, though, to have some philosophical background for the two or three more technical chapters.