Mengzi: With Selections from Traditional Commentaries

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Bryan W. Van Norden (trans.), Mengzi: With Selections from Traditional Commentaries, Hackett, 2008, 207pp., $12.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780872209138.

Reviewed by Hui-chieh Loy, National University of Singapore


As one of the four books "traditionally taken to express the essence of Confucianism" (xiii), the Mengzi (or more commonly in the English speaking world, Mencius) has been a source of philosophical inspiration to the Chinese intellectual tradition for over two thousand years. (The other three are the Analects, the Greater Learning, and the Mean.) According to its new translator, the Mengzi is also the one among the four "most likely to speak to contemporary readers", and the one he would recommend "without hesitation" as the Confucian classic "to read first" (ibid.). With these remarks, Bryan Van Norden introduces his edition of the classic. But what exactly is the point of the new translation, given the existence of several serviceable and even well regarded English translations in recent times (Van Norden himself mentions the ones by James Legge and D. C. Lau)? Let me answer that by way of another question: What special contribution or contributions does this new effort make? I will highlight three and structure my review around them.

I will begin with the mundane: this affordable volume is potentially a good textbook for teaching Mengzi, in English, at the undergraduate level. The volume comes with an introduction that includes useful pages on the intellectual-historical context within which Mengzi lived, a brief précis of Mengzi's philosophy, and some remarks about later developments, especially Zhu Xi's (1130-1200 C.E.) Neo-Confucian reinterpretation of the Mengzi. There is also a timeline of important events from the legendary times of Chinese history to 1905 -- when the last Imperial Dynasty, the Qing, abolished the old civil service examinations (in which Zhu Xi's interpretation of Mengzi featured prominently) -- and a select bibliography of works on Mengzi (and Zhu Xi) and other related topics of interest. At the back, there is an English-Chinese Glossary of many of the key terms that recur in the text, though unfortunately, no index. The translation follows the traditional division of the Mengzi text, but with the 'chapters' further sub-divided into numbered sections, which greatly facilitates referencing. Throughout the translation, there are also a good number of footnotes that point the reader to other related ancient Chinese texts and contemporary scholarship on specific issues. And this is on top of the "running philosophical commentary" that I will discuss below. Additional "grammatical and lexical notes" on the translation to be made available on Hackett Publishing's website have been promised but do not appear ready as of the time of my writing this review (see The translation also Romanizes Chinese words using the Hanyu Pinyin method, which is more familiar to a contemporary student. In all, the volume comes with a wealth of features that will be profitably used by the bulk of its intended readers -- college students reading Mengzi.

Two: as the preface reminds the reader, the new translation has its source in a series of "Comments and Corrections" collated by Van Norden though based on the cumulative researches of David S. Nivison, P.J. Ivanhoe, and Van Norden himself, and growing out of "thousands of hours" teaching the text (ix). In fact, Van Norden has very generously made these notes available online for some time now (the version of June 26, 1997 can be accessed at Students of Chinese philosophy familiar and in agreement with these proposed modifications to Lau should not be disappointed as Van Norden has incorporated nearly all of them into the new translation. It is the opinion of this reviewer that, in general, the new translation inherits the overall dependability of Lau while incorporating more recent advances in scholarship. It is also rendered idiomatically. For instance, at 6B2 (p. 159), rather than leaving "Wu Huo" in the text and explaining who he is (probably a legendary figure known for his strength), Van Norden simply has "Gargantua". Purists will balk but, in truth, the point of the segment has not been distorted by the device. He also thankfully does not over-translate the qing that appears in 6A6 as "essence" (as A. C. Graham would have preferred) but just "what [people] are inherently" (cf. Lau's "what is genuinely in [people]").

But this is not to say that there is nothing at all with which one might want to find fault. For instance, Van Norden translates the opening line of 4B26 as:

Mengzi said, "When people in the world discuss 'nature,' they are referring simply to what is primordial. What is primordial is based on what happens smoothly."

This is hardly perspicuous (there is no commentary attached to the line either); certainly not as perspicuous as the

As for what the world in general says about our nature, it is simply appealing to our characteristics at birth. Those who appeal to our characteristics at birth take profit as fundamental

that Van Norden adopted in his "Comments and Corrections", following the work of A. C. Graham. Granted, this is a very obscure line in the original; but perhaps a note to that effect (i.e., "this is a very obscure line") would have been the prudent thing to do.

Sometimes, it might just be a matter of the translator's being forced to choose between readings. For instance, Van Norden renders Mengzi's criticism of Gaozi in the closing line of 6A1 (p. 144) as "your doctrine will surely lead people to regard benevolence and righteousness as misfortunes for them …" This follows Zhu Xi and Legge (and Van Norden's own "Comments and Corrections") in reading the verbal huo as a putative ("regard as misfortune"). Lau, on the other hand, reads the verbal as a causative ("to bring about misfortune") together with Yang Bojun (Mengzi Yizhu; 1984) and Zhao Qi (died 201). Grammatically, both readings seem possible. While either reading would have allowed the reader to perceive the modus tollens argument that Mengzi is mounting against Gaozi, each gives a slightly different sense to the implied unacceptable consequence of Gaozi's doctrine. Perhaps less controversially, Van Norden opts to render the "zhi yi ze dong qi, qi yi ze dong zhi ye" at 2A2.10 (p. 38) as "When your will is unified, it moves the qi". (Don't worry too much about the use of "will" since Van Norden has already explained that the term here only means "the heart when it is focused on some goal"; "qi" is also extensively explained earlier on p. 37.) This agrees with Yang Bojun and Zhu Xi, and disagrees with Lau ("The will, when blocked, moves the [qi]. On the other hand, the [qi], when blocked, moves the will") who was probably following Zhao Qi. Zhao Qi is probably wrong about this one.

A third and probably most distinctive feature of Van Norden's Mengzi is its inclusion of a "running philosophical commentary". In this, Van Norden's Mengzi carries on a trend set by Edward Slingerland's Analects and will soon be followed by Brook Ziporyn's Zhuangzi (among others in the series). The comments themselves are largely drawn from Zhu Xi, probably the most important and influential of the pre-modern commentaries on the Mengzi, but here and there, the views of other pre-modern scholars are mentioned as well. Though far from a complete translation of Zhu Xi's Mengzi commentary, Van Norden's volume contains enough to give the student a good sampling of the riches contained therein. This is, at present, a rare treat since so much of the pre-modern scholarly tradition remains untranslated and thus not readily accessible to the English speaking world. In any case, Van Norden's avowed aim is "not to present Zhu Xi's interpretation [of Mengzi], but to empower modern English readers to understand and appreciate the Mengzi for themselves." Given this aim, it is not surprising that Van Norden also includes his own views in the running commentary, and the views of other contemporary scholars who worked on the Mengzi (e.g., David Nivison for 1A7 and 3A5, and Kwong-loi Shun for 6A4), though not always to endorse them. Iris Murdoch makes a guest appearance on p. 41.

Let me make clear that I am in sympathy with Van Norden's effort of including selections from the commentarial tradition in his translation. I am of the opinion that the traditional commentaries on the classical texts are still worth reading and should be read by modern students of, e.g., the Mengzi. The question is whether Van Norden's aim (to "empower modern English readers to understand and appreciate the Mengzi for themselves") has been efficiently served by his procedures. Here, let me begin what might seem a relatively minor nitpick. The text of the commentary is literally inserted into the flow of the Mengzi text, marked off from the latter only by the fact that it is in a slightly different font, italicized and enclosed within square brackets. The typography has the most unfortunate effect that thanks to it, readers may find it hard -- at a glance -- to quickly sort out on the page where the comments are and where the Mengzi text. In this respect, Van Norden's Mengzi is a step back from the earlier published Slingerland's Analects. (The commentary there occupies its own paragraphs, differently indented from the main text, and in a smaller font.) I suppose the reader is supposed to be encouraged -- constrained by typographical necessity, as it were -- to read the commentary not merely as so many footnotes from which one may crib, but as one continuous conversation between the Mengzi text, Zhu Xi, and others students of the Mengzi text including Van Norden himself. But even with this in mind, one would have thought that the interest of the reader -- the audience to such a conversation -- is better served when not confused as to who is saying what. A better typography could help in this respect especially for the college level general reader who is the expected user of the volume. This is something that I hope Van Norden (and the publishers) will consider fixing in a future edition.

I dwelt a bit on what appears to be a minor point because it does relate to a potentially more interesting issue concerning Van Norden's rationale for including the commentary in the first place. In explaining his decision to include the running commentary, Van Norden claims that "contemporary Western readers frequently have a prejudice that, in order to best understand a text, one should read it by itself, ignoring the commentarial tradition that has developed around it". This is a prejudice since "even a text like the Mengzi, which often speaks in terms that a person in any era or culture could appreciate, sometimes cries out for philosophical commentary" (citing the example of 2A2.8; xiv). This sounds right. A bit further down, Van Norden tells a story about how he has heard "more than one scholar earnestly discuss 'Mengzi's claim that human nature is originally good'. But as he points out, what Mengzi said was "Human nature is good" (xv; see also 3A1.3). Van Norden implies that the scholars were unwittingly influenced by Zhu Xi's very influential commentary, which glosses Mengzi in that way. Paraphrasing Santayana, he offers the following dictum: "Those who do not read the commentaries are doomed to repeat them" (xv).

I confess that when I first read about how these scholars believed that for Mengzi, human nature is originally good, the first culprit that came to mind was not Zhu Xi's commentary but the opening lines of the Three Character Classic (sanzijing) so well known to every child brought up in anything like a traditional Chinese curriculum. (The first two trimetrical lines say: "ren zhi chu xing ben shan": "At people's beginning [i.e., their birth], [their] nature is originally good".) But whatever the source of such a misunderstanding, the point that Van Norden is making here suggests that even for him, there really is such a thing as an "original" or "real" message of the Mengzi ("human nature is good") that can be obscured by a later orthodoxy ("human nature is originally good"). Put another way, if the scholars that Van Norden met were deficient in their understanding of Mengzi, it doesn't seem as if the solution is really to get people to be reading Zhu Xi (or Nivison or Van Norden or Ivanhoe or Shun) as opposed to the Mengzi. Rather, what seems most needful is that the student reads the Mengzi, even if all concerned could also agree that Zhao Qi, Zhu Xi, and for that matter, Nivison, Shun, Ivanhoe, and Van Norden, have much to offer that can help the modern reader in understanding Mengzi. The trick as always, I suppose, lies in finding that balance between the Scylla of attempting to learn from others without putting in that requisite mental effort of one's own and the Charybdis of doing the reverse that Master Confucius spoke of (Analects 2:15). Or, speaking now from the perspective of the pedagogue, of finding that happy medium in which the student is empowered through one's guidance to understand and appreciate the text, but understanding and appreciating the text for themselves. Did Van Norden succeed in finding something of this balance in his edition of the Mengzi? This reviewer, at least, is inclined to say that the answer is, on balance, a cautious "yes". In all likelihood, much will depend on how the volume is actually put to use in a classroom setting.

All in all, it is the opinion of this reviewer that Van Norden has done a service to the study of Chinese philosophy in English in producing his translation of Mengzi. The volume's natural place is in a college classroom (in the English speaking world). I thus recommend it without hesitation for consideration to prospective students and instructors of Chinese philosophy.