Mental Language: From Plato to William of Ockham

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Claude Panaccio, Mental Language: From Plato to William of Ockham, Joshua P. Hochschild and Meredith K. Ziebart (trs.), Fordham University Press, 2017, 283pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823272600.

Reviewed by Eric W. Hagedorn, St. Norbert College


In recent years, scholars of later medieval philosophy have come to believe that some medieval philosophers held theories of mental representation that seem markedly similar to the contemporary Language of Thought Hypothesis. Scholastic thinkers of the 14th century, such as William of Ockham (d. 1347) and John Buridan (d. 1360), argued that thinking occurs by actualizing various mental representations and that these representations could be most accurately described using linguistic/grammatical categories. On their accounts, mental representations have both signification and supposition (very roughly, in contemporary terms, they have both meaning and reference); some representations bear grammatical properties such as number, case, tense, and mood; simple representations are capable of being combined in well-defined ways into more complex representations; and the semantic values of the complex representations are dependent upon the semantic values of their constituents. Thus it is illuminating, according to these thinkers, to speak of thought as taking place by means of mental nouns and mental verbs that are combinable into mental sentences and mental syllogisms.

Yet what has often been lacking from the scholarly discussions of these later medieval theories of mental language is a clear understanding of the genesis of these theories; indeed, until now there has been no English-language monograph that attempts to cover the historical development that led Ockham and his contemporaries to hold such views. Joshua Hochschild and Meredith Zeibart have thus done a great service to Anglophone philosophers by releasing this translation of Claude Panaccio's 1999 French book Le discours intérieur: De Platon à Guillaume d'Ockham. No one has done more to further the understanding of medieval theories of mental language than Panaccio. In a series of books and articles dating back to the early 1980s, writing in both French and English, Panaccio has investigated both the fine details and the broad brush strokes of these medieval theories of mental language. His central focus throughout his career has been Ockham's account of mental language, an account most thoroughly documented in his Ockham on Concepts (Ashgate, 2004). But in this work, he turns his attention to the story leading up to Ockham, attempting to trace "the emergence and formation of the theme of mental language" beginning with Plato and proceeding through "the Stoics, Neoplatonists, church fathers, Arabs, and medieval scholastics". (4)

The volume also includes an all-new postscript from Panaccio, in which he reviews some important developments in scholarship that have appeared since the original publication of the French edition and also responds to a few of his critics. The inclusion of this review of recent work by (among others) Martin Achard, Jeffrey Brower, Susan Brower-Toland, Eric Hagedorn, Adam Kamesar, Peter King, Isabelle Koch, Martin Lenz, John O'Callaghan, Taki Suto, and Luisa Valente makes the new volume useful even for those scholars who were already acquainted with the French edition. In what follows, I'll begin by providing a brief summary of the main text; I'll then close with some comments on the translation.

In Part I, Panaccio catalogues and provides brief discussion of nearly every known occurrence of expressions relating to "interior discourse" from Plato through the 10th century. The focus begins with documenting Neoplatonic and Early Christian usages of Greek terms such as logos endiathetos and êso logos in authors such as Philo, Plotinus, Porphyry, Ireneus, and John Damascene. It then switches to occurrences of Latin terms such as verbum in corde and oratio in mente in Christian authors such as Augustine, Boethius, and Anselm. There is even a very brief discussion of similar locutions found in the Arabic philosophical tradition in the works of al-Fārābī and Ibn Sīnā.

The book's second part covers the 11th, 12th, and 13th centuries, focusing especially on debates concerning mental representation in the period from Thomas Aquinas (d. 1274) to John Duns Scotus (d. 1308). Chapters 6 and 7 are particular highlights. In Chapter 6, Panaccio briefly explains Aquinas's attempt to locate the mental words posited by Augustine within the psychological faculties of Aristotle's De Anima and then gives a detailed review of criticisms and defenses of Aquinas's teaching in the succeeding decades by Henry of Ghent, William de la Mare, Peter John Olivi, Roger Marston, Thomas Sutton, William of Ware, John Duns Scotus, and Harvaeus Natalis. Chapter 7 covers debates from the same period on the questions of how words and concepts signify their significates and whether the things thus signified are external to the mind or not.

Lastly, the short third part focuses on Ockham and his contemporaries. Chapter 9 quickly provides an overview of Ockham's theory of mental language, making clear how Ockham's doctrines respond to the debates surveyed in Part II, while chapter 10 offers a brief glimpse of the development of mental language theories after Ockham.

As with any book that attempts to cover everything of importance said on a particular philosophical issue from Plato to Ibn Sīnā in its first 99 pages, and everything from Anselm to Scotus in the following 80, the work gives less attention to some figures than the reader might wish -- though, to the author's credit, there are far fewer cases of this than one would expect. And though some figures receive less attention than desired, others get more. One particular surprise is that, on Panaccio's reading, the early Christian writer Justin Martyr is of central importance as perhaps the figure who brings the Greek psychological terminology of "interior discourse" into the Christian tradition. On the other hand, Augustine -- the medieval philosopher who both then and now is uniquely associated with the concept of "mental word" -- almost becomes just another character in the story, with the entire development of his doctrine across four major works (De dialectica, De magistro, De doctrina christiana, and De trinitate) covered in a mere nine pages. (Admittedly, Augustine's name is repeatedly raised in later chapters, but the emphasis there tends to be on how other thinkers develop Augustinian ideas.) Aquinas and Scotus receive a great deal of attention in the second part, but so do a whole host of less well-known figures, many of whose contributions turn out to be just as important as those made by the more canonical thinkers.

One fault of the book is that -- at least prior to the new Postscript -- Panaccio never makes entirely clear what he thinks is necessary and sufficient for a given theory to count as a theory of mental language. One way of dividing the landscape of contemporary theories says that, in order to count as an instance of the Language of Thought Hypothesis, a theory must posit mental representations that are both semantically and syntactically complex; that is, molecular representations must actually have atomic representations as constituent parts, and the semantic value of any given molecular representation must be a function of the semantic value of its parts.[1] Panaccio seems to adopt a similar criterion as a necessary one for mental language; e.g., Gregory of Rimini's theory that mental sentences are metaphysical simples (being semantically complex without having any syntactic structure) is said to cast doubt on "the very existence of interior discourse" because it "strip[s thought] of internal compositional structure." (208-9). Elsewhere, however, other criteria seem to also be invoked. Plato and Aristotle are said to not have theories of mental language in part because "neither is willing . . . to explicitly project onto thought the grammatical noun/verb structure;" (27) similar remarks are made about many other philosophers prior to Ockham who do not explicitly speak of mental nouns or mental verbs. It is only in the Postscript, while responding to Peter King, that Panaccio makes explicit that on his account a theory of mental language must both "analy[ze] human thinking in grammatical and semantical terms" and give "a compositional account of mental propositions on the basis of the semantical properties of their components." (237)

Panaccio's demand that a theory of mental language must utilize grammatical categories in this way seems unnecessary though. Even if a given account of concepts does not call some concepts "mental nouns" and other concepts "mental verbs," it is still the case that, on nearly every theory canvassed in the book, there are distinct concepts of Socrates and of sitting. Whether we call the concept Socrates a mental noun, it is still the concept of a substance, and whether we call the concept sitting a mental verb, it is, nonetheless, the concept of an action. It is hard for me to see what, in the end, is doctrinally important about calling these concepts "nouns" and "verbs." (It may of course be developmentally important, insofar as using these labels may lead one to posit that thought is composed syntactically in ways similar to the ways that ordinary languages are. But this developmental point surely can't be what decides whether a theory counts as a theory of mental language at all.)

This tension between doctrine and development crops up several times, mostly in the first part of the book. Panaccio admits in the Postscript that his principal interest was "in explicit occurrences of complex phrases simultaneously referring to both mind and speech (like 'verbum mentis,' 'locutio intellectualis,')", and Part I attempts to draw out the importance of all such usages in ancient and early medieval philosophy. But, of course, a given thinker might well use an expression like "inner speech" without actually having anything like a theory of mental language (much as someone might use the expression "mind's eye" without intending to thereby express any commitment to rationalism).

As for the quality of the translation, it is quite good throughout. At times it preserves French word order or uses direct English cognates rather than constructing more natural English prose, e.g.: "I would readily propose, by way of hypothesis, the name of Justin, martyred in Rome around 165" (54) and "he reserves the appellation 'word' for the complete concept" (128). But I saw no cases where this stylistic choice prevents understanding. I noticed only two mistranslations that could engender mild confusion. First, the reader might well wonder why philosophers at the University of Paris were hesitant to depart from "the secular association of the sign with the sensible," (145, my italics) unless she is aware that the French 'séculaire' can have the meaning of timeless, age-old, long-attested. An inadvertent historical error is made when the translation asserts that "[Ockham's Ordinatio] was written down by the author himself" rather than the more accurate "[Ockham's Ordinatio] was the result of a redaction by the author himself" (180, fn 5).

A curious feature of the translation arises from the translators' choice to utilize previously published English translations of the ancient and medieval texts whenever available. So, for instance, when Panaccio presents a block quote from Anselm's Monologion, the translators replace the extract from Pierre Rousseau's French edition with an extract from Thomas William's English translation (104-105). But when such English counterparts are not available, they instead translate from the French translation of the work in question. For example (in contrast to the Anselm case above), a block quote from Boethius's commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione is an English translation of Panaccio's own French translation of the Latin text (89). This is largely unproblematic, but becomes evident in several places where the English translation used noticeably differs from the French translation Panaccio worked with. For instance, Ockham's hypothesis of mental propositions "which are not of any language" is repeatedly stressed by Panaccio, using precisely those words; but that exact phrase does not appear in the Michael Loux translation used in the accompanying block quote (181), leaving the reader to wonder why Panaccio keeps placing that phrase within quotation marks.

Of course, these are at the end of the day small concerns, and the fact that these are the whole of my issues with the translation should itself speak for its overall quality. Hochschild and Ziebart are to be commended for their efforts in bringing this important work of medieval scholarship to a wider audience.


[1] See, e.g., section 1 of Aydede, Murat, "The Language of Thought Hypothesis", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2015 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).