Metaphor and Continental Philosophy: From Kant to Derrida

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Clive Cazeaux, Metaphor and Continental Philosophy: From Kant to Derrida, Routledge, 2007, 221pp., $115.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415324007.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Powell, Marshall University


Clive Cazeaux's Metaphor and Continental Philosophy: From Kant to Derrida is an ambitious book. It seeks to treat metaphor in a number of selected figures from the historical tradition indicated in the title, but especially in Kant, Nietzsche, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Ricoeur, and Derrida. This is no easy matter, for little is said of metaphor in Kant, Merleau-Ponty, and Heidegger, which leaves one with the task of creating what might be said from out of what has been said. This is an especially difficult task in the case of metaphor, for one is forever tempted to address metaphor as the absence of metaphor, which is to say that one is tempted into providing an account of metaphor in a conceptual, literal discourse. Cazeaux is certainly aware of this difficulty even if he frequently gives in to the temptation. It also seeks, or I assume that it does, to exhibit the relevance of continental philosophy as an historical continuation of the philosophical tradition. What is more, Cazeaux attempts to show that the continental tradition is not only tied to its historical constitution, but that it has also been concerned with the development of strategies for transforming that tradition, strategies that he collects under the name of metaphor. Additionally, Cazeaux wants his study of metaphor to gain some traction with the analytic tradition. One of his theses is that the continental treatment of metaphor can provide the analytic tradition with some much needed tools, especially those in the analytic tradition open to the consequences of the study of metaphor for ontology (in particular, Max Black).

In my opinion, it is the attempt to serve so many masters that makes the book a rather unsatisfying read. While it is true that in the end Cazeaux argues for a Heideggerian-Derridean view of metaphor as the interweaving of metaphor and metaphysics (metaphor-as-metaphysics, metaphysics-as-metaphor), it is also true that the Heideggerian discourse gets woven into a metaphorical system to which it became increasingly foreign. That is to say, Cazeaux too frequently resorts to a traditional metaphysical language (e.g., perception, sensation, empiricism, realism, subject-object, theory of knowledge, etc.) for the expression of Heideggerian themes, as if we have now moved beyond Heidegger's concern with the language he found to be inadequate, or even counter-productive, for what was developed in Being and Time. Cazeaux seems far too comfortable expressing Heideggerian themes and concerns in the language of conceptuality, as if Heidegger might be grouped in with a certain epistemological school. It is as if it is possible to distillate the thought of Heidegger into a few pearls of wisdom and translate that wisdom into the current language of the metaphysical tradition, the analytic tradition, or cognitive psychology. While it might well be problematic that the thought of Heidegger seems to be embedded in the language of Heidegger, it should also be noted that this is a problem, not just for Heidegger, but for any thinking deemed to be historical.

Cazeaux's attempt to enlighten us about metaphor occurs over eight chapters, the most common denominator of which is Heidegger. He begins with two chapters concerning Kant and Heidegger, the first concerning the first Critique and Heidegger's reading of it in Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, and the second concerning Kant's third Critique and the situating of metaphor within the ontological domain. Chapter 3 concerns metaphor and the senses in Merleau-Ponty and Lakoff and Johnson, along with Locke as a contrasting position to Merleau-Ponty. Here Cazeaux relies on Merleau-Ponty's synaesthetic analyses to further argue the ontological value of metaphor, a value that is then transferred onto the epistemological domain. Chapter 4 attempts to extend the discussion of the senses towards the Heideggerian notion of truth, an extension that I find problematic as practiced by Cazeaux. While the Heideggerian portions of Cazeaux's book up to this point are often difficult to follow, he exercises a clarity of expression in the fifth chapter in discussing Nietzschean perspectivism and a number of differing accounts of it (Danto, Kofman, Anderson, Clark, Richardson, along with competing views of propriety offered by McDowell, Nagel, and Dennett).

Chapter 6, "Cutting nature at the joints: Metaphor and epistemology in the science wars," like the previous chapter, achieves a level of clarity not enjoyed by the chapters that attempt to explain those working in continental philosophy. After presenting a number of versions of "glass mirror epistemology" and "strong sociology of knowledge," or the realist/anti-realist debate, Cazeaux asserts that the entire debate is itself determined through a recourse to metaphor. However, this recourse to metaphor is not a stylistic device -- or, at least not entirely -- but rather, "because the task of epistemology is itself fundamentally metaphorical … a looking down on oneself from above, an attempt to view how one views, a double perspective which, it seems to me, can only be achieved through metaphor" (p. 143). For Cazeaux, what is needed is not an attempt to extract ourselves from metaphor, but rather a new set or "family" of metaphors that can accommodate the realism/anti-realism positions but in the absence of opposition.

This new family Cazeaux finds in the use of opening and belonging in Heidegger and Bachelard, which he attempts to address in chapter 7. In this chapter Cazeaux offers sections devoted to the open or opening in Heidegger and Bachelard, which are followed by treating poetic opening in both and the "epistemological status of belonging." In his discussion of the Heideggerian open, Cazeaux appeals to treatment of truth as aletheia. Oddly, though, Cazeaux makes no mention of the revealing/concealing structure of aletheia, choosing instead to focus on what he calls the "photosynthesis" metaphor employed by both Heidegger and Plato, as well as how his interpretation of Heidegger situates Heidegger within the realism/anti-realism debate. I find this an odd use of Heidegger, and one that requires a selective use of Heideggerian texts that is a consistent drawback throughout Cazeaux's book. As an added note, Cazeaux also appeals to Descartes's famous analysis of the piece of wax as a contrasting element to Bachelard's treatment of science, but his appeal is to Descartes's wax example in his Discourse which, as far as I know, does not exist (the example is from the Meditations). In addition, if one expects to find a new re-thinking of belonging that will serve for the creation of a new epistemology, one will be disappointed. Belonging is not so much re-thought as eliminated, eliminated because it is no longer known whether it is "the subject possessing some qualities and the object possessing others," but "it is instead left permanently as a question" (p. 171). What seems to escape Cazeaux at this point in his analysis is that, for Heidegger at least, belonging in this context is not relevant inasmuch as there is no "subject" to which "qualities" might belong.

Chapter 8 is a discussion of Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida, as well as an analysis of Ricoeur on Heidegger and Derrida and another of Derrida on Heidegger and Ricoeur. Overall, I find this more satisfying reading, as the attempt to represent each of the three seems more defensible in both its particulars and general orientation. I think Cazeaux does a defensible job both in his attempt to answer for Ricoeur against some of Derrida's objections and in his attempt to answer for Derrida against some of Ricoeur's objections. What I do find troubling, however, is the manner in which he situates metaphor with regard to the as-structure in Heidegger (actually, this was troubling throughout his earlier discussions of the as-structure). More specifically, Cazeaux wants to attribute the as-structure to the workings of metaphor, because "metaphor is a condition of possibility in as much as it provides the as-structure" (p. 192). The problem is that metaphor is only operative within the metaphysical determination of the "as." That is to say, when Heidegger remarks in 1955-56 that "The metaphorical exists only within metaphysics," to which Cazeaux returns again and again, it should be kept in mind that metaphor is part of the metaphysical system that is charged with interpreting the "as" in terms of the apophantical-as. To interpret the hermeneutical-as to simply be saying that something can appear as something else really changes nothing, for in both cases the something is taken to be some extant object subject to some epistemological theory. Cazeaux occasionally seems to recognize this, but more often it seems he does not.

In addition to the difficulties I have with Cazeaux's interpretation of the as-structure, I have another more specific problem that I would generalize as a type of problem that plagues a fair amount of Cazeaux's book. Chapter 4, "Heidegger and the Senses," is both insightful and problematic, sometimes both at the same time. Strictly speaking, Heidegger did not discuss the senses in any traditional way, nor did he engage in discussions or analyses of perception. However, we do find analyses of various historical discussions of the senses, and we find discussions concerning the Greek αΐσθησις. It is from these discussions that Cazeaux attempts to construct a Heideggerian treatment of the senses. More specifically, he turns to two texts, Being and Time, and the 1931-32 lecture-course translated as The Essence of Truth. The manner in which Cazeaux works with these texts, what he cites, how he cites, and how he pieces together what he cites, is troubling, and it illustrates what is perhaps most troubling about his entire book. There is a kind of patchwork quality to his study that often does not hang together. This is not to say that the individual pieces of his study might not offer new insights into the role of metaphor in continental thought since Kant, but that the reader is left to do much of the work for Cazeaux, the work of thinking through the connections among those pieces. When Cazeaux attempts to draw together aletheia, the as-structure, and the senses, he first assumes an as-structure with regard to the senses, which he then connects to truth or aletheia by means of perception. It might well be correct to attribute the as-structure to the senses, but this does not amount to a particular quality enjoyed by the senses that is not relative to Dasein in general. That is, insofar as the as-structure is fundamental, it will be relevant to the senses, which are not fundamental but follow upon Dasein's being-in. To simply conflate or identify the two is a mistake. But, this is what Cazeaux does when he writes that perception is a part of or an aspect of the disclosedness of the being of the da (p. 101).

Cazeaux identifies perception with the as-structure and thus with aletheia in the following manner. He first appeals to Heidegger's thinking of truth as aletheia, noting that aletheia concerns the operation by which what shows or discloses itself does so from itself. The disclosedness of Dasein reveals it as being-in-the-world, and being-in-the-world is further revealed through what in the world discloses itself. Cazeaux cites Heidegger when he writes in Being and Time that "Disclosedness is constituted by attunement, understanding, and discourse, and pertains equiprimordially to the world, being-in, and the self."[1] This particular citation of Heidegger is drawn from his discussion at the very end of DIVISION ONE, section 44, "Da-sein, Disclosedness, and Truth." The citation is then followed by the following remark by Cazeaux: "One aspect of this attunement, for Heidegger, is sense perception" (p. 89). As already stated, however, sense perception or the senses are founded upon attunement, not a part of attunement. Heidegger is very clear about this: "And only because the 'senses' belong ontologically to a being which has the kind of being attuned to being-in-the-world, can they be 'touched' and 'have a sense' for something so that what touches them shows itself in an affect" (1996, p. 129). But, for the purpose of supporting his claim regarding sense perception, Cazeaux resorts not to Heidegger's discussion concerning attunement, but a much earlier discussion concerning the Greek αΐσθησις, a discussion drawn from the second introduction in which he treats the notion of logos. While the two discussions (in Heidegger) are indeed relevant to one another, the discussion concerning perception in the Greeks, which also occurs in The Essence of Truth volume, cannot be presented as if it concerns the discussion in section 44.

While there is a fair amount to recommend in Cazeaux's study -- chapters 5, 6, and 8 -- I also had the feeling while reading much of it that I was visiting Socrates's trial with "speeches finely tricked out with words and phrases" to convince me of a reading that was too frequently just not plausible enough. Alas, I cannot recommend Cazeaux's book.

[1] Martin Heidegger, Being and Time, trans. Joan Stambaugh (Albany: SUNY Press, 1996), p. 203. I have followed Cazeaux in citing the Stambaugh translation.