Metaphysical Disputation I. On the Nature of First Philosophy or Metaphysics

Metaphysical Disputation I On The Nature Of First Philosophy Or Metaphysics

Francisco Suárez, Metaphysical Disputation I. On the Nature of First Philosophy or Metaphysics, Shane Duarte (trans. and annotated with corrected Latin text), The Catholic University of America Press, 2021, 359pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813234021.

Reviewed by Jorge Secada, University of Virginia


This book is a major contribution to the history of philosophy, and in particular to the study of Renaissance and Early Modern metaphysics. Francisco Suárez (1548­–1617) has long been recognized as a towering figure of Late Scholasticism, the movement associated with the revival of the Aristotelian philosophy of the Schools in the XVI and XVII centuries, usually thought to begin with Thomas de Vio, cardinal Cajetan (1468–1534). Suárez’s Metaphysical Disputations is a crowning philosophical achievement of that era, though his noteworthy contributions cut across the discipline, ranging from political philosophy and the philosophy of law (his more widely studied writings for some time), through ethics and the philosophy of mind, to metaphysics. Philosophical interest in his writings has been on the rise recently. Yet there is still much work ahead before we can come to a satisfactory understanding both of his philosophy itself and of its relations to those that came before or after it, as Shane Duarte points out (xi, xix–xxi, xxvi). This book is an important step in that direction.

This is, as its title indicates, a translation of the first of the fifty-four disputations comprising the whole of Suárez’s vast book, which deals with real being and its transcendental properties (unity, truth, good), its causes and division into infinite and finite, and with created substance and its accidents in the nine Aristotelian categories. Remarkably, the work concludes with a disputation on unreal things that have “no other . . . positive being than to be given to the intellect”, the study of which, though strictly outside the scope of metaphysics, is necessary but has no other more natural place (Disputation LIV, Section 1, §6; my translation). This initial disputation, on the other hand, is focused on the “nature of metaphysics” (xxiii). In turn, it examines its names and object, its scope, its unity, its functions, its perfection, and the natural desire for it.

Unlike the other disputations that have appeared in English, this one also includes the original Latin facing the translated text. In this, however, it is not unique when placed in the context of translations into other modern languages. Of particular importance here is the 1960 Gredos edition of the whole of the Disputations both in Latin and in the Spanish translation of Sergio Rábade Romeo, Salvador Caballero Sánchez, and Antonio Puigcerver Zanón.[1] The original text used for that edition was taken from the XIX century Vivès standard edition of the complete works, of which the Disputations had been edited by Charles Berton.[2] Rábade et al. claimed to “basically” follow Vivès, recognizing however that it contained “misprints and even errors” which they corrected by reference to “three or four” unspecified early editions, indicating only “the variants that substantially change the meaning of the text”.[3] The Gredos text has been a main source for scholars seeking to consult Suárez in the original, as well as that used in other bilingual editions. For instance, the 1996 Italian edition and translation by Costantino Esposito, corrected and republished in 2007, though using the Vivès text, also takes into account the Gredos one.[4] And Duarte himself started preparing the Latin text for his own translation from the on-line text of Salvador Castellote and Michael Renemann, which was a scan of the Gredos (xci).

Here we find a first major contribution to Suarecian studies of the volume at hand. Noticing some “quite significant errors” when comparing the Gredos text to that of the first edition of the Disputations (J. and A. Renaut, Salamanca, 1597), Duarte systematically compared both, using the first edition as the standard, and bringing to bear fifteen other editions published between 1599 and 1751 whenever he found differences. The different readings are carefully recorded in footnotes. Some of the differences between the first edition and the Vivès and Gredos texts are indeed significant. In his “Remarks on the Latin Text and the English Translation” Duarte highlights three: “internal (internos)” instead of “external (externos)” (296, n.87); a negative phrase substituted with its affirmative (84, n.16); and the omission of a phrase appealing to the lack of a sufficient reason (128, n.32). Here are, as examples, a couple of other differences which end up either obscuring or directly altering Suárez’s intended meaning, and which have affected published translations of the text. In Section 3, §1 where Suárez inquires into the specific unity of metaphysics and makes the straightforward point that its numerical unity is not the issue for “this science is numerically multiplied in different human beings”, Vivès and others omit “human beings (hominibus)” (120, n.30). This led Esposito to the unclear “multiplied in different cases”.[5] Rábade et al. did better here by introducing “individuals”, apparently correctly inferring Suárez’s intention.[6] In Section 2, §13 where Suárez has “other sciences, whether moral, or rational, or practical”, Vivès ignores “or rational” (92, n.18). So do Esposito and Rábade et al.[7] A last example: Vivès and others following that edition misplace Suárez’s marginal title of Section 2, §3, “Foundation (Fundamentum)”, moving it to §4, which makes no sense. One noteworthy textual contribution of this edition is to emphasize against some commentators that these marginal titles and notes are present in the first and all the other consulted editions published during Suárez’s lifetime, so they can be safely attributed to him. Duarte carefully respects all such marginalia where Vivès omits some altogether or, as just noted, capriciously changes the place of others.

Duarte’s Latin text is not strictly that of a critical edition, but it comes very close. It follows the first edition, which, without a more direct source, is our best link to a draft from Suárez’s own hand, noting where it diverges from Vivès and comparing it to fifteen early editions, ten of which appeared during Suárez’s life. As far as the first of the Disputations is concerned, this is now clearly the standard Latin text to use.

Duarte’s translation is excellent, careful, and intelligent. Translators face a dilemma: to be faithful to the original and sacrifice fluency, or to construct a text that reads well but which may perhaps not remain quite as faithful as possible to the original. In poetry and more generally in literature and depending on the translator’s own genius and creativity (I think here of Baudelaire or Borges translating Poe, for instance), taking liberties with the original for the sake of the results is perhaps not just permissible but even desirable. At the other extreme we have the case of mathematical or scientific texts, or any seeking to convey straightforward information, where fidelity to the original is imperative. Philosophical texts, in my opinion, stand closer to this end of the spectrum, though not without some major qualifications. In some cases, to convey the sense of a philosophical text the translator may need to imaginatively recreate it in the new language, particularly when at its core the original shares features with literary texts. A translator of a philosophical masterpiece is an interpreter trying to elucidate or make sense of difficult and complex reasoning and ideas. Many of Jonathan Bennett’s versions of early modern texts are remarkable examples of lucid translations fully acknowledging their uninhibited interpretative character.

This edition and translation of the first of Suárez’s Disputations is directed to scholars, philosophers, and others with a serious interest in the subject. Duarte has opted, to my mind correctly, for closer fidelity to the original rather than the greater clarity that freer interpretation may yield. Still, the English version reads very well. His concern with readability without sacrificing fidelity is apparent in his use of subscripts. Consider this phrase in Section 1, §1, where in the context of discussing the names of metaphysics Suárez explains that it is called “first philosophy” for “this science is wisdom itself” and it “considers things that are divine or separated from matter, as well as the common naturesr of beings that are capable of existing without matter” (14­–17) The phrase “common naturesr” translates “communes rationes”. Like the related Greek logos, the Latin ratio needs to be translated by different English words, depending on context and intended meaning. Duarte uses the following for it: reason, argument, accountr, aspectr, basisr, characterr, conceptr, conception­r, considerationr, groundr, methodr, naturer, notionr. The subscript easily indicates to the reader what is the word being translated with an English word that may also be used to render a different Latin word or to convey a different meaning. Conversely, for example, the single English “to know” and its cognates renders the different Latin words “noscere” and “scire” and their cognates. The use of subscripts allows Duarte to conveniently indicate how the original text reads in such cases also. A minor comment: Duarte’s concern with fidelity may have led him slightly astray here. A third Latin word that may be translated with “to know” and a subscript is “cognoscere”. Duarte instead opts for the less straightforward and somewhat unusual but etymologically closer “to cognize”.

The volume also contains an extensive bibliography of first editions of Suárez’s works; of the consulted early editions; of translations into modern European languages of the Disputations; of other primary sources; and of a couple of useful resources and some of the secondary literature, particularly relating to the first disputation. A comment, for the sake of completeness in reference to translations of this disputation: Duarte misses the early translation into Spanish in the widely circulated Colección Austral of Metaphysical Disputations 1, long the only one available in that language (and to judge by the translations mentioned in his bibliography, in any of the other included languages), by Javier Adúriz, with an introduction by the Spanish-Argentinean philosopher Ismael Quiles, SJ (Espasa Calpe, Madrid, 1943). It is worth mentioning also that Adúriz and others went on to produce a selection in Spanish of texts from the Disputations (Espasa Calpe, Madrid, 1955).

Before the edition and translation of Suárez’s text, and his prefatory remarks on them, Duarte includes a sizable and very useful introduction. Some of it covers Suárez’s life and works, the genesis and structure of the Metaphysical Disputations, and its place within the history of metaphysics, though, as he states when referring to the secondary literature on this last point, he focuses on “Suárez’s influence on how the science of metaphysics itself is conceived”, so as to remain within the scope of the disputation that follows (xx, 34). Still, and for instance, I found little here to illuminate his relation on this particular point to his proximate successor, Descartes, even though I myself have found that placing the Meditations in the context of the First Disputation is truly enlightening precisely on how Descartes conceives first philosophy. To use an example cited above for a different purpose, Suárez’s discussion of the use of the name “first philosophy” for metaphysics can help illuminate Descartes’s own choice of it in the Latin title of the Meditations and perhaps even also the changes introduced in the title when he allowed it to be translated into French. Duarte of course bears no blame for this, as there is little along these lines in the literature.

The bulk of the nearly eighty-page introduction, however, is designed to offer “a rather detailed survey of Suárez’s discussions in DM 1” (xxvi). As Duarte explains, he pays “more attention” to Sections 2, 3, and 4 “since they pose the greatest interpretative challenges” (xxvi). His discussion is a substantial contribution to the interpretation of Suarez’s views.

As Duarte states, in Section 1 Suárez argues by elimination that “the adequate object of first philosophy . . . is real being” (xxxiii). In the following three sections, Suárez addresses several issues arising from this claim. Metaphysics does not study all real things in their specific natures, as that pertains to other sciences. Its specific objects are God, immaterial substances, and real accidents. But amongst its subjects are included also the nature and properties of being itself, of substance and accident, of act and potency, of the four causes, and indeed “any nature . . . common to . . . both material and immaterial things” (xxxvi). Questions arise here as to the unity and possible subdivisions of metaphysics, given its diverse subjects, and both as to its relation to “the other main theoretical sciences, physics and mathematics” and regarding its uses and purposes (xxxvii). To address some of these, Suárez argues that unlike the objects of natural science, which are material and sensible, and of mathematics, which are material and intelligible, metaphysics considers things which can exist without any matter. Interestingly, Duarte highlights the apparent and unresolved inconsistency between the initial claim that metaphysics studies real being and the conclusion of Section 2 that what unifies its objects is their conceptual and existential independence from matter (see xlviii–l).

One of the richest discussions in the Introduction concerns the notion of “formal ratio under which”, central to the way Suárez distinguishes between the objects of metaphysics and of other sciences (xxxvii). Another has to do with “first philosophy’s usefulness for perfectly acquiring the other sciences” (lxi). In footnotes throughout these discussions Duarte engages with the secondary literature. And he lays out much of the relevant context, both antecedent and subsequent, of Suárez’s thought on these matters, presenting and examining views of Cajetan; Antonio de Olivera (1583–1637), one of the Discalced Carmelite Complutenses; Antonio Rubio (1548–1615); Gabriel Vásquez (1549–1604); and many others. The Introduction to this book is indeed a significant addition to the study of Suárez’s conception of metaphysics.

Much of the philosophically worthwhile work on Suárez has tended to remain within the context of his own Aristotelian framework. There are of course notable exceptions (Heidegger, for example), and there is an increasing number of commentators who address him seeking to gain from him philosophical understanding which may not necessarily share those Scholastic presuppositions. This is particularly relevant when looking at his reception in early modern and subsequent philosophy. But it is also important in terms of the plain understanding of his thinking and of the light it can shed on metaphysical inquiry. It is here, unfortunately, that I found Duarte at his weakest. It is perhaps reasonable to appeal without further elucidation or justification to the “Aristotelian conception of a theoretical science” when introducing Suárez’s search for “some community of nature among the particular things dealt with” in metaphysics (xxxvii). And in an introductory essay of this size, it is understandable that independent philosophical discussion be limited. But to ground without any further comment or explanation, even if Suárez himself does it, the proposition that “where we love A for the sake of B, B is loved to a greater degree than A” on “the principle that that on account of which each thing is X is X to a greater degree” is to put forward a claim which on some straightforward readings is plainly false and which cries out for philosophical explication (lxxxvii; see 285). Similarly, I find that to state that “color . . . is a genus divisible into species (yellow, blue, white, etc.)” without mentioning the difficulty of finding differences that can yield such division, again regardless of how common such claim might have been, is to skirt required philosophical clarification (xxxix; see xli). Notwithstanding, such few shortcomings are minor, particularly when placed on the side of the many accomplishments of this study.

In the jacket of this book, we are told that Duarte has already translated the next three Metaphysical Disputations and that they will be published soon in this same collection. Judging from the considerable achievements of this first volume, we can only look forward with anticipation to that most promising event.

[1] Francisco Suárez, Disputaciones Metafīsicas, Gredos, Madrid, 1960–1966, 7 vols.

[2] Francisco Suárez, Opera Omnia, Vivès, Paris, 1856–1878, 28 vols.; the Disputations are found in vols. 25 and 26.

[3] Op. cit., vol.1, p.16; my translation.

[4] Francisco Suárez, Disputationi metafisiche I–III, Bompianti, Milan, 2007; p.49.

[5] Op. cit., p.161; my translation.

[6] Op. cit., vol.1, p.256; my translation.

[7] Respectively, p.135 and vol.1, p.243.