Metaphysics and God: Essays in Honor of Eleonore Stump

Placeholder book cover

Kevin Timpe (ed.), Metaphysics and God: Essays in Honor of Eleonore Stump, Routledge, 2009, 262pp., $118.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415963657.

Reviewed by William J. Abraham, Southern Methodist University


Eleonore Stump is one of the most penetrating, creative, humanly sensitive, and rigorous philosophers of religion on the current scene. She deserves the very best of honors for her labors; this collection of essays is fully worthy of her stature and work.

The volume as a whole divides into two uneven parts: Part I with eight essays devoted to Preacipue de Deo, dealing with the divine nature and attributes; and Part II with six essays devoted to Preacipue de Hominibus, issues related to human persons. There is a short Foreword which provides a brief overview of her work, focusing on the crucial role she has played in the recent stretch of her career at Saint Louis University. Within this one cannot miss the special gifts that she has as a teacher. There is also a felicitous Introduction by the editor that provides a handy survey of the range of Stump's work across the years, provides a sense of the wider historical context, and gives a fine overview of the book as a whole. The book ends with a useful bibliography. The essays engage in a lively fashion with Stump's work, with several essays not surprisingly dealing with the work of Thomas Aquinas. Taken together they provide a model of work in analytic philosophy of religion: they are elegant, economical and well organized, provide reviews of pertinent recent literature, privilege the mode of formal logic, and reflect appropriately in places the feel of highly technical intramural debate.

Several of the essays cluster together in a pleasing manner. In the last three essays Jason Eberl, Scott Ragland, and Christopher Brown tackle issues prompted by the Christian belief in the afterlife. Eberl, drawing on Stump and Robert Pasnau's recent work on Aquinas, argues that a human person persists between death and resurrection, composed of but not identical to his or her soul alone. Ragland develops a fascinating argument in which the damned in hell can repent, hence eroding the distinction between hell and purgatory. Brown argues that human community and friendship are essential to supreme human happiness in heaven, thus supplementing but not rejecting Aquinas' claim that God alone is the object of perfect human happiness. Lynne Baker and Timothy O'Connor interact with Stump's highly original work on the problem of evil. Baker basically agrees with the fundamental moves made by Stump but argues that the resources she makes available can be borrowed by compatibilists without the shedding of any philosophical tears. O'Connor provides a fine reading of The Brothers Karamazov that fits snugly with the deep sensibility exhibited by Stump on the problem of evil. Two essays take opposing positions on the virtues of Molinism. Jonathan Kvanvig insists that in the debate to date Molinism is unmotivated; John Martin Fischer upholds the important claim that Molinism offers a unique response to the problem of fatalism. Brian Leftow, Tom Senor, and William Mann provide incisive essays on (respectively) the divine attributes of simplicity, eternity, and love.

The four remaining essays work through the following set of issues. Peter Van Inwagen argues that, whatever we may be committed to when we speak of God creating all things visible and invisible, this does not commit us to claiming that God created abstract objects, for the latter cannot enter into causal relations. Tom Flint provides an illuminating account of the idea of fitting reasons in Anselm's Cur Deus Homo, arguing that there are unresolved problems for Anselm nested in other elements of his thought. In an especially dense chapter John Hare provides a way of understanding how a human's goodness supervenes on being. Finally, Michael Rea furnishes a remarkable paper on divine hiddenness, recasting this problem as a problem of divine silence. The latter is compatible with divine love insofar as God provides a way to experience divine presence through the narratives of scripture and participation in liturgy.

This last essay by Rea signals an important turn for recent work in philosophy of religion. Rea's work to date has been a model of rigorous, formal analytic work. He leaves none of that rigor behind in this essay. Yet one senses a different tone here in that Rea draws us into the inner riches of the Christian faith as found in the scriptures and the liturgical life of the church. This is a welcome development. Analytic philosophers have often been nervous about this kind of move, as if it might diminish their analytic rigor or invite dismissal from secular philosophers because such reflection might appear much too emotional or pious. Rea certainly shows that these fears are misguided. More importantly, his work and this volume as a whole here shows that the distinction between philosophy of religion and philosophical theology has simply collapsed. Philosophers have not abandoned traditional topics like the attributes of God or the problem of evil; but they have begun a march right into the very core of Christian doctrine and practice. It is no surprise that Rea has become a keen leader in the development of analytic theology, for this is the natural next step in the development of philosophical reflection on religion in the analytic tradition.

I am not at all sure if theologians are ready for this important change. The aversion to all things analytic runs very deep indeed. Many, if not most, mainstream theologians have for the most part been involved in a heavy interaction with liberation theology and the wider political theorizing involved. They look upon analytic theology as much too abstract and disengaged to be of much value. They fear, as some critics of analytic philosophy have feared, that analytic philosophy harbors untoward and unacknowledged political commitments. Alternatively, theologians have been making serious efforts to connect theology with spirituality, to bring the deep faith of the church into conversation with the life of worship and prayer, and vice versa. Again, this development does not hold out much hope for a positive response to the work of analytic philosophers. For this reason there is the need for the kind of firmness, resilience, and patience that shines through these essays. Philosophers of religion have been operating in something of an intellectual wilderness; so they are well able to stay the course where theologians are concerned. I predict it will take a lot of work across the next generation to see much fruit for their labors; but fruit there most certainly will be in the years ahead. It is clear that there is a younger generation of theologians who can be recruited to share in the critical work on the full range of Christian doctrines (and Jewish and Islamic doctrines too). While this is a volume for veterans in analytic philosophy of religion, it deserves to be read by theologians.

I have one major caveat. One of the deeply attractive features of Stump's work is the sheer humanity that shines through in both its verbal and oral forms. One cannot read her work, or listen to one of her presentations, or watch her respond as an interlocutor, without knowing that one has encountered a really profound soul. There is a spiritual depth and discernment in all she does that is attractive, serene, and totally authentic. This is entirely fitting in that there is something missing if reflection on the divine remains merely analytic and abstract; the discourse deployed should at some point reflect the grandeur of the subject matter. This is not to say that excellent work cannot be done by unbelievers; nor is it to wish out of existence the highly technical work that philosophers will naturally do in their writing. It is rather to be on the lookout for work that improves on excellence and takes the discourse to a whole new level. Stump's work just naturally improves on excellence. One can therefore commend the work of Stump as a paradigm case of the kind of philosophical work that should be read and pondered by theologians. Hence I readily suggest to theological students that they should make the time and effort to become acquainted with her work on, say, the problem of evil.

In the light of this it is disappointing not to have a much fuller account of Stump's intellectual pilgrimage laid out in a volume devoted to her work. To be sure, both the Foreword and the Introduction ably provide a narrative of her academic work across the years. Yet it would have been entirely fitting if we had been furnished with a sensitive account of Stump's spiritual pilgrimage and how that intersected with the shifts in her professional development and with the unique human angle which shines through her work on the problem of evil. I can understand the reluctance at this point. Some matters are best left private; they belong in a different genre, like that of memoir. Some scholars simply find it difficult to bare their soul or to have others say too much about their inner journeys. However, I know orally how gripping her journey has been, and I cannot but believe that, given her perspective and style of philosophical reflection, this volume would not have been enriched by a fuller account of her life.