Mind and Its Place in the World: Non-Reductionist Approaches to the Ontology of Consciousness

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Alexander Batthyany and Avshalom Elitzur (eds.), Mind and Its Place in the World: Non-Reductionist Approaches to the Ontology of Consciousness, Ontos, 2006, 323pp., $94.00, ISBN 3937202986.

Reviewed by William Seager, University of Toronto at Scarborough


In this eclectic if not eccentric set of essays we find diverse challenges to the materialist orthodoxy that reigns in modern philosophy of mind. It is impossible to go though all thirteen essays in any detail, and no overarching theme unifies the collection. I will attempt to briefly characterize the essays and point out some arguments of interest.

The introduction consists of the standard overview of the collection, with brief synopses of the essays, followed by some remarks by the brilliant young physicist, Avshalom Elitzur, on the peculiar difficulties of the problem of consciousness. This will seem familiar to philosophers, but it is interesting (and a kind of 'reality check') to see how quickly and how deeply the problem of subjective experience can grab a sophisticated non-philosopher. Many philosophical problems lack this universal appeal and depth; it is good to know that the problem of mind can still really engage people. Elitzur has a lively philosophical imagination, and his essay presents the so-called 'hard problem' of consciousness via some nice thought experiments.

The next essay, by Hoyt Edge, presents what seems to me to be a highly confused attack on what is labeled 'reductionism' but which appears to be a much broader notion than I would recognize as such (perhaps better characterized as 'objectivity'). Edge insists that all modern reductionist, non-dualist theories of consciousness maintain that 'consciousness represents' (p. 29). In light of the sceptical reception of the representational theories of consciousness (such as those of Dretske or Tye) and the contrary position that the qualia of conscious states are or possess features which are utterly non-representational, this is a curious remark. Edge further claims that reductionism is committed to physical atomism. I see no reason to assert this, although the more abstract principle of part-whole mereology might be what he is aiming at. This remark of Edge's gives a pretty fair taste of the tone of the whole essay:

atoms exist in space … making them inherently independent and without relationship to other atoms … This interpretation can be seen in juxtiposition (sic) to what … "space" is in Japanese, which is that space connects objects. (p. 30)

There follows a rather rambling and discursive essay on the epistemology of Bernard Lonergan by Donald Merrifield and its possible relation to consciousness; students of Lonergan's philosophy may find the essay of some interest.

More tractable philosophical material can be found in the essay of Peter King, in which a thought experiment is advanced in the venerable tradition of the brain transplant scenario. The thought experiment is primarily concerned with making the claim that interactionist substance dualism is both a coherent position and, in principle, empirically testable. Such a test, if successful, would entail the breakdown of what is called the causal closure of the physical world (roughly the idea that every physical event has a purely physical complete cause if any cause at all). King wishes to emphasize that causal closure is an empirical hypothesis, no matter how much it may be treated as an inviolable methodological principle by materialistically inclined philosophers (and scientists). Although I think King is right about this, the seeming consequences of denying closure, notably violation of a host of conservation principles, would necessitate the complete overthrow of our present physics and thus one might be forgiven for thinking that the balance of plausibility remains heavily weighted toward materialism in this respect.

There follows an interesting and clearly argued paper by Russell Panier and Thomas Sullivan which seeks to refute identity theories of the mind-body relation (broadly construed to include functionalist accounts) and advance a version of property dualism. Although the argument is complex, involving a number of controversial premises, two seem particularly dubious to me. The first is the claim that all physical state tokens have a spatial location, by which is meant that all physical states bear highly determinate spatial relations to all other physical things. This premise is at odds with current physics, in which particles can be in regions without being further localizable. Thus these particles do not stand in definite spatial relations to other things in that region. For example, an electron can be in a state where it makes no sense to ask whether it is nearer to the right or left wall of its container, although it is definitely in the container. The second questionable premise is more metaphysical; it is that any physical state can, in virtue of being a physical state, bear only physical relations to any other thing. If physicalism is true and everything that exists is physical then this premise might be true by default. But it seems wrong to insist that such a principle follows merely from something's being physical. If one believed in abstract entities such as numbers, one might be happy to allow that physical objects that weigh 2 pounds bear a non-physical relation to the number 2. Descartes believed that the body bore a non-physical relation to the mind, but that did not prevent the body from being a physical thing. If Russell and Panier turn out to be right in their dualism then it follows from their characterization of the physical that there are no physical things at all (since any physical thing can be thought about and so enter into non-physical relations).

Panier's and Sullivan's argument is that mental states about what they call 'instantiables' (properties or state types) must be non-physical because they bear a relation to a non-physical entity. Instantiables are non-physical because they are non-spatial and hence cannot get into a physical relationship with anything. The argument founders in its reliance on the overly strong requirement that physical things can enter into only physical relations.

One might also wonder whether 'mental aboutness' is a relation at all. It seems better to think of it in terms of representation. Since X can represent Y even if Y does not exist, 'represents' cannot be a relation. It is hard to see why a physical thing cannot represent a non-physical entity (any physical instance of the numeral '2' will serve as an example). I suspect therefore that the proper analysis of intentionality will undercut Panier's and Sullivan's argument as well.

Peter Lloyd's essay audaciously attempts to resurrect Berkeleyian idealism. The attempt faces a number of traditional difficulties that Lloyd addresses with ingenuity but not complete success. In order to answer the objection that our language is very largely about a non-mental reality independent of our subjective states Lloyd advances a neo-verificationist and phenomenalist account of language: 'the information I actually convey [with my utterances] is about my sensory impressions, not about the unobserved putative substrate' (p. 107) and 'the meaning that is intended to be conveyed by the utterance is not the set of truth conditions but rather the set of truth-tests' (p. 107). The example given to bolster this bracingly 'retro' view is that of a virtual reality setup something like that in the Matrix films in which one can seemingly truthfully report that one is 'in the training room' even while one's body remains back in the grubby real world. But it does not follow that utterances express phenomenal 'truth-tests' instead of truth conditions. Truth conditions might be contextual, utterances might be elliptical with an unspoken 'in the virtual reality' added in appropriate circumstances, or it may be that falsehoods can be part of pragmatically successful speech.

Although Lloyd is happy to say -- with Berkeley -- that the world is a construction of real and possible sensory impressions, he does not address the classic objection that this construction presupposes an independent world. All general claims about sequences of sensory impressions can be undermined by a physical hypothesis, and no refinement of the laws of association amongst sensory states will eliminate this possibility. Thus, the experience of seeing a match struck (granting one can give a purely experiential rendering of descriptions like this that seemingly make reference to non-sensory items) is followed by the experience of the match lighting … unless the match is wet. This is in stark contrast to a host of claims about sequences of physical events which cannot be undermined by a merely experiential proviso. The gravitational force between two objects is given by Newton's equation (close enough) and no fact purely about what experiences someone might be having serves to undermine this claim, although of course the physical content of some experiences might serve as evidence against the physical generalization itself.

Lloyd forthrightly accepts that the sort of phenomenalist idealism he endorses requires semantic resources which are purely internal yet powerful enough to ground reference to the foundational sensory impressions. Obviously, this courts the notorious private language argument of Wittgenstein. Lloyd constructs an interesting social reductio of Wittgenstein's argument. If the private language argument is valid then an equally damaging version of it can be constructed against any public language, since the community of language users has no way to guarantee that the world and 'social memory' is not changing in ways strictly analogous to the way Wittgenstein supposed that an individual's memory and impressions could not be changing in ways invisible to the subject. Such an argument is not original with Lloyd but he does not consider other formulations or any responses to it.

Parapsychological topics arise in several of the papers. Fiona Steinkamp's essay is ostensibly on telepathy but in fact is an interesting reflection on the conditions necessary for thought ownership. She suggests that two aspects are central: origination and integration, where these have both a 'factual' and a phenomenological dimension. Telepathy involves receiving the thoughts of others and in this respect is analogous to standard communication which also, if generally tacitly, involves issues of thought identification and attribution. Although she does not address the issue, her theoretical framework would have interesting application to the bizarre syndrome of 'thought insertion' (a 'first rank' symptom of schizophrenia) in which people claim that their minds are, as it were, hosting the thoughts of others.

Following Steinkamp, Steven Lehar presents a defence of an indirect realist theory of perception. According to Lehar, perception is always of a brain-constructed inner model of the world. Lehar develops some interesting ideas, especially about the structure and geometry of perceived space (quite different from the presumed Euclidean geometry of the physical space which humans find themselves). Lehar does not deny the intuitive implausibility of the idea that all we ever perceive are our own mental states; he says the theory is incredible. But, he claims, so too is its rival: direct realism, which, as construed by Lehar, claims that 'we can have experience of objects out in the world directly, beyond the sensory surface, as if bypassing the chain of sensory processing' (p. 171). I do not find this theory as incredible as Lehar's indirect realism. It is phenomenologically accurate to say that we experience objects 'as if' bypassing the chain of sensory processing; we have no first hand knowledge or experience of this highly complex and multifaceted enabling condition for perception. While it is possible to read the advertisement for direct realism as pumping a magical theory of perception, it is more generous to take it as claiming that sensory processes are the means by which we get into perceptual contact with the world and its objects. One appealing way to understand this takes perceptual experience to be constituted by the content of inner representations. This content is of the external world, but it is constrained by the particularities of our sensory systems. In fact, it seems that such a representational account supports a nice rapprochement between the two extremes which Lehar presents, which allows for the exploration of a distinctive phenomenological structure of the world as perceived without sacrificing our perceptual contact with it.

Riccardo Manzotti follows with a curious paper in which consciousness is in some way identified with existence. I am far from thinking that I understand his argument, which is based upon a strong version of what is sometimes called Alexander's Dictum: nothing exists except what has some causal effects. Manzotti takes the rainbow as an example of an existing thing. Supposedly, its causal effects are dependent upon there being observers in the right place to apprehend its appearance. Manzotti takes this to show that there is no separation between subject and object. Now, I don't see why the rainbow does not have some effects whether or not an observer is present. The rainbow is that pattern of radiation such that if an observer were at a certain position a rainbow experience would occur in the observer. This pattern has lots of other effects too, so it hardly matters whether an observer is actually present or not. So I cannot begin to follow Manzotti, but I will note another claim of his I have trouble understanding. This is that the hard problem of consciousness is solved by his proposal since 'there is a candidate for the nature of phenomenal experience: the physical processes engaged between the brain and the external environment' (p. 211). This is confusing because I thought Manzotti was challenging the distinction between brain and external environment. But more important, I can't see how this even begins to address the hard problem, since no reason is given why these particular processes should give rise to, or constitute, phenomenal experience.

The next essay, by Paul Løvland, develops an extended analogy between chemical processes and intentional action. It is easy to make fun of this, say by recalling Schiller's account of catalysis:

is not this [that is, catalysis of a reaction between A and B by the catalyst C] strangely suggestive of the idea that A and B did not know each other until they were introduced by C, and then liked each other so well that C was left out in the cold. (as quoted by Edwards 1967)

But Løvland goes some way toward advancing the more reasonable claim that mental processes can be regarded as the interaction of various forces. Such an idea has been more rigorously explored by followers of the dynamical systems approach to cognition.

Howard Robinson's essay is a refreshing return to careful and clear analysis. His essay has a radical goal, to defend a dualistic understanding of mind and personhood, or at least to suggest some virtues of such an account. The first half of the essay argues that any naturalistic understanding of persons will inevitably generate the paradoxes which lead to 'radically reductive theories of personal identity and self' (p. 245). This argument is carefully constructed and pretty convincing. Since Robinson finds the consequences of 'person reductionism' unacceptable, he advances instead a radical theory of persons and time, which essentially posits that the self is outside of or transcends 'physical time'. To the extent that such a view is correct, it supports the idea that the self is not physical. Robinson's view also has an interesting, if at present sketchy, bearing on the issue of temporal passage and presence.

The final two essays return to the more bizarre themes of the collection. The first, by Gershon Kuriziki, is a mathematical analogy linking Spinoza's metaphysics with the quantum formalism. It turns out that Spinoza's mental-physical parallelism is the entangled superposition of mental and physical states. Amusing if nothing else, Kuriziki proclaims this quantum Spinozism 'helps me resign myself to my lot in life' (p. 276). The final essay, by Kenneth Arnette, deploys the paranormal phenomenon of 'near death experiences' (paranormal insofar as they cannot be explained in neurochemical terms, and subjects of them have knowledge -- e.g. of details of the operating room -- which could not be obtained via normal sensory channels) to argue for a dualistic metaphysics in which the world state is akin to a vector with both mental and physical components (the quantum formalism is not used to express this idea however). The argument is as good as the data from near death experiences, about which the reader may remain sceptical.

On balance an interesting collection of essays, this volume is a useful reminder that physicalism has not utterly swept away all opposition and, although physicalists will not be persuaded, thinking about the challenges presented here is good mental exercise.


Edwards, P. (1967). 'Panpsychism' in the Encyclopedia of Philosophy, vol. 5, P. Edwards (ed.), New York: Macmillan.