Mind, Language, and Metaphilosophy: Early Philosophical Papers

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Richard Rorty, Mind, Language, and Metaphilosophy: Early Philosophical Papers, Stephen Leach and James Tartaglia (eds.), Cambridge University Press, 2014, $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107612297.

Reviewed by Paul Churchland, University of California, San Diego


This glowing collection includes Rorty's earliest publications -- from 1961 through 1972 -- and his earliest attempts to deal with the broad landscape of problems that engulfed our discipline in the second half of the 20th Century: most centrally (for Rorty), analytical reductionism, the mind/body problem, the distinguishing or defining feature of the mental, and the proper methodology for philosophy itself. The arc of Rorty's adventures here mirrors the arc of our professional concerns generally in that period, not least because Rorty was an influential contributor to those discussions, but also because he addressed in depth the work of his most prominent philosophical contemporaries, such as Carnap, Wittgenstein, Ryle, Strawson, Sellars, Quine, and Dennett. His insightful commentaries on these figures, and others, are worth the price of this collection all by themselves.

But a larger issue shapes the relevance of Rorty's essays here. Despite an initial philosophical education that was decidedly classical, Rorty was captured by C.S. Peirce's late 19th-century pragmatism, a philosophical perspective that never left him. And that fertile perspective dominates all of his philosophical activity throughout these essays. For example, given the basic pragmatist conviction that the ultimate function of cognitive activity is to survive in and to navigate the peculiar environment in which one happens to be embedded, a philosopher is very unlikely to find plausible a story that attempts to reduce or translate all empirical statements into a unique and philosophically basic vocabulary of sensory simples. For the sensory vocabulary we happen to use is also plastic, is also in the business of helping us to navigate the world, and is ultimately to be evaluated by the pragmatic virtues that drive and select our conceptual resources generally. Understanding our sensory access to the world is indeed of major importance, and it commands constant evaluation and reevaluation. But our first-person sensory judgements themselves do not constitute an independent touchstone, forever free from pragmatic evaluation. According to Rorty, they are an integral part of the overall epistemic contest. Classical empiricism is thus pushed aside.

For a second example, in his highly influential "Mind-body identity, privacy, and categories," Rorty defends the Identity Theory (or what he calls the Disappearance form of it) against the charge that mind-state/brain-state identity statements commit a category error by arguing that the pragmatic virtues of making first-person psychological reports in the language of a completed theory of brain activity -- instead of in the current language of 'mental states' -- might well outweigh the initial 'oddness' of the reports that constitute such a novel practice. We have survived such transitions in the past, he notes. Rorty cites our contemporary reports of 'bacterial infections' versus our ancient reports of 'demonic possessions' as illustrations of such transitions. And these transitions were motivated ultimately by pragmatic considerations as well.

For a third example, in the paper just mentioned and in two others, Rorty convincingly explores the credentials of the familiar claim that the incorrigibility of first-person psychological reports is the sure mark of an ontologically distinct domain of mental phenomena, and he finds that such incorrigibility, if we concede it at all, need reflect nothing more than our collective pragmatic decision not to allow anything to override such reports, a practical decision currently made in a state of substantial ignorance, a decision that might well be reversed in light of new scientific insights into our cognitive states and activities and the emergence of new ways of detecting and correcting our cognitive errors. Kurt Baier's trenchant paper is his main target here, and Rorty's critique of Baier's epistemological position is exemplary.

For a fourth example, in many of these essays Rorty repeatedly urges philosophers not to assume that their findings will have a unique epistemological status or concern matters that are beyond the reach of the sciences themselves, broadly conceived. Ultimately, Rorty is convinced, pragmatic considerations govern all of our epistemological endeavors. Given his sympathy for Quine's rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction, this conviction is no surprise. But it is intriguing to see a philosopher urging our own profession ultimately to be governed by the same aims and the same methodology that govern the natural sciences. Philosophical speculation, from this perspective, is just one among the leading edges of scientific speculation in general. Given my own pro-scientific prejudices, the reader of this review will not be surprised to hear me applauding Rorty's methodological audacity here.

But my own sympathies aside, there are still oddities, ironies, and curiosities about Rorty's arguments and about the motivations behind the most famous of his positions. Perhaps the first of these issues is the basic motivation behind his doctrinal pragmatism in the first place. Here in the 21st century, the most natural and compelling motivation for a specifically pragmatic epistemology is the perspective of modern evolutionary biology. Given that metabolic and reproductive success is what drives the preferential existence of certain creatures generally, it is hard to resist the idea that broadly pragmatic virtues are what govern the behaviors of actually surviving creatures, their cognitive behaviors included. But a deep scientific appreciation of evolutionary biology is apparently not what drove Rorty's pragmatism, nor his arguments in support of that pragmatism. The standard theory of biological evolution over billions of years might even be false for all of the difference it would make to Rorty's specific version of pragmatism. For Rorty's primary epistemological focus is on the pragmatic adventures of any cognitive creature during its cognitive lifetime. That period is of course of extraordinary importance, and I agree with Rorty that its developmental dynamics display a strongly pragmatic profile. But to focus exclusively on that eye-blink period is to ignore the broader historical context in which those comparatively local adventures are located and to which their local dynamics are ultimately owed. It will blind us to the long-term pressures that shaped cognition in the first place and to the diverse forms that it may take.

This means that Rorty apparently did not feel the current theoretical pressure to actively seek a theory of cognitive activity that places our specifically human activity in the same kinematical and dynamical bag with, first, the cognitive activities of all of the other brain-governed animals currently on the planet, and, second, with the activities of all of the other cognitive creatures that preceded us on that long evolutionary continuum. In particular, and despite his repeated defense of eliminative materialism, he apparently did not feel moved to try to replace our current and profoundly linguaformal conception of cognitive activity -- a conception that portrays us as home to a dynamical dance of propositional attitudes -- with a different and more general conception of cognitive activity that is capable of encompassing the undoubted activities of the billions of non-linguistic and pre-linguistic creatures that also boast intricate cognition.

To be sure, Rorty insists that the categories currently deployed within our ongoing propositional attitudes may and often will change. But in contemplating the possibility of a future science of our mental lives, his concern is not to displace thoughts themselves, but merely what those thought are about. For example, on the very first page of "Mind-body identity, privacy, and categories," he explains the forward-looking Identity theory as proposing that "sensations (not thoughts) are identical with certain brain-processes" (my italics)! (Notice the crucial and unexpected restriction here, made by Rorty himself.) But surely a comprehensive theory of our brain activity will include an account of what our thoughts are, and of what thinking is, and not just of what sensations such as pain are. Rorty plainly explores what notions might replace the latter ("C-fiber stimulation," e.g.). Oddly, however, he never explores, or shows much interest in, what novel notions might explain or replace the former. And yet those former notions are precisely those that must concern any future, brain-based epistemological theory, one drawn, presumably, from some development of cognitive neuroscience.

But perhaps I am expecting too much here in citing Rorty's lack of contact with, and apparent disinterest in, the disciplines of evolutionary biology and cognitive neuroscience. He was, after all, writing in the 60s and the 70s. And, to his credit, he makes a genuinely compelling case for pragmatism, eliminative materialism, and anti-foundationalism even in advance of those burgeoning disciplines. His papers here, all of them, provide a rousing introduction to this revolutionary phase of modern philosophy, and they would support an insightful graduate seminar into the issues that there gripped our own discipline. The editors of this volume are to be congratulated.